Newton as Philosopher

Placeholder book cover

Andrew Janiak, Newton as Philosopher, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 296pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521862868.

Reviewed by Richard Arthur, McMaster University


There has been a long tradition of hostility on the part of Newton scholars to attempts to situate Newton's philosophy in relation to his predecessors' and peers'. To claim any philosophical ancestry for Newtonian doctrines, from this point of view, is just to miss the point that Newton initiated a whole new style of doing philosophy, where quantitative reasoning and a careful subjection of nature to experimental interrogation (one is permitted here to allow a debt to Bacon) replaces the traditional argumentative approach of the Schools as the correct methodology for natural philosophy. Newton, on this view, was a natural philosopher, but one who changed the terms of the debate, and refused to get embroiled in fruitless controversies over metaphysics. Of course, this broadly positivist conception -- encouraged as it is by Newton's own remarks on method -- has not been without its detractors. In particular, Edwin A. Burtt (1925) showed how Newton's conceptions of space and time were deeply indebted to Henry More's notion of extension as a category of spirit, to Barrow's teachings regarding space and time as absolute quantums, and to contemporary controversies about the nature of God's relation to the natural world. Interest in Newton as a philosopher was rekindled, as evidenced by H. S. Thayer's publication in 1953 of Newton's Philosophy of Nature, which, like Janiak's own recent compilation (Newton 2004), contained excerpts from Newton's Principia, Cotes' 1713 preface, from his correspondence with Bentley, Cotes and others, and from the Queries to the Opticks, although not the important essay De gravitatione. Following in Burtt's footsteps, Alexandre Koyré and others also drew attention to the full metaphysical context in which Newton developed his ideas, and in the 1960s this trend of thought was built upon and developed by Thomas Kuhn, Paul Feyerabend and Imre Lakatos into a full-blown critique of positivism, calling into question the very idea that a scientific theory could be developed or justified independently of the constellation of specific commitments concerning ontology, scientific method, and so on, that constituted the framework for its gestation, birth and acceptance. In this milieu, Newton studies grew hugely more expansive, and in addition to the many fine specialist works on Newton by I. Bernard Cohen, R. S. Westfall, John Herivel, Ernan McMullin, A. I. Sabra, François De Gandt, George Smith, Nico Bertoloni Meli and others, studies of the broader aspects of Newton's natural philosophy were made by J. E. McGuire on Newton's Neoplatonism and connection with the Corpus Hermeticum, Betty-Jo Dobbs on Newton's Herculean labours in the non-mathematical tradition of alchemy/­chemistry, and Frank Manuel on Newton's natural theology.

So it is somewhat surprising to be confronted with a book on Newton's philosophy that begins with a chapter, "Newton as philosopher, the very idea." In this chapter Janiak observes, uncontroversially enough, that Newton did not present a philosophical system, "an overarching theory of knowledge or response to global skepticism", but instead "deals systematically with those elements of metaphysics that are intimately connected with his work in mathematical physics" (9). The latter claim, though, in precluding the relevance of what we have learned from the excellent studies on Newton's alchemical and theological researches mentioned above, tells us more about Janiak's conception of what falls under "natural philosophy" than Newton's.

For what Janiak presents us with in this book is a treatment of Newton's natural philosophy centered on his mathematical physics; not, however, on his mathematical physics as a whole, which would encompass his corrections to and improvements on Descartes' algebraic geometry, his optics, and his contributions to fluid mechanics, but only on what is admittedly its most distinctive novelty, namely the inverse square law of attraction for gravitational force. Thus the main topics considered are the nature of the metaphysics that can be ascribed to Newton given his distrust of metaphysical speculation about the cause of gravity (chapter 2), the question of the status of Newton's force of attraction (chapter 3), the question of the relation of Newton's natural philosophy to the mechanical philosophy, including whether gravity or mass are essential properties of matter (chapter 4), the question of whether and to what extent Newton's commitment to absolute space can be justified given his empiricist methodology (chapter 5), and issues concerning the relation of God to space and the created world (chapter 6).

There are three main interpretations that Janiak identifies and discusses (chapter 2). First he considers the traditional positivist one described above, according to which Newton's hypotheses non fingo is interpreted as an eschewal of all metaphysics. This is found wanting principally on the grounds articulated by Howard Stein, recently expanded on by Robert DiSalle, according to which Newton is willing to address metaphysical questions, but only provided and to the extent that they can be informed by the secure results of empirical research. Thus the force of gravity is said by Newton in the General Scholium of the Principia to act "not in proportion to the quantity of the surfaces of the particles on which it acts (as mechanical forces are wont to do) but in proportion to the quantity of solid matter" (Newton 1999, 764; Janiak, 26). So for Newton "it is obviously not a hypothesis that gravity acts non-mechanically" (27), and his non fingo applies only to hypotheses as to the causes of this force, and not to any metaphysics whatsoever. This take on Newton's attitude to metaphysics, styled "Newton's radical empiricism" by Janiak, is also implicit in Stein's much celebrated 1966 paper on Newton's concepts of space and time (1970), in which he takes to task Mach, Reichenbach and Burtt for not understanding that what Newton says on these topics is not idle metaphysics, but part of a sustained critique of the inadequacy of Cartesian relativism to provide a satisfactory foundation for the mathematical treatment of motion.

The third interpretation is Janiak's own. He astutely observes that Newton actually agrees with his contemporaries that a substance cannot act where it is not present (35). So in this regard, and contrary to the Stein-DiSalle interpretation, Newton's commitment to the no-action-at-a-distance metaphysics is as resolute as the mechanical philosophers', and not up for empirical refutation. Moreover, the difference of Newton's view from his main rivals' is precisely that divine action can only take place by divine presence. This, Janiak suggests, is what he holds in reserve as a possible solution to the problem of gravity's cause, should no ether theory be up to the task. If no material substance can mediate action between distant bodies, then it must be mediated by something else, whether an active principle of some non-mechanical kind, or God himself.

At this juncture one might have expected a discussion of the other non-mechanical principles Newton recognized in his philosophy of nature: for instance, the "certain secret principle in nature by which liquors are sociable to some things and unsociable to others" he refers to in a letter to Boyle in 1679 (Newton 2004, 6), not to mention the attractions of electricity and magnetism, and the "powers, virtues, or forces" by which "small particles of bodies … act at a distance not only upon the rays of light for reflecting, refracting and inflecting them, but also upon one another for producing a great part of the phenomena of nature" (Opticks, Query 31; Newton 2004, 132). Surprisingly, Janiak is silent about Newton's active principles. Instead he interprets Newton's denial of action at a distance as directly conferring "a potential role" for God's spatiotemporal ubiquity "as a medium for all gravitational interactions" (40). As noted, however, this divine omnipresence is an item of Newton's metaphysics that is not negotiable. Thus Janiak presents his interpretation as an amendment to the reading of Stein and DiSalle, bifurcating Newton's metaphysics into the empirically revisable "mundane metaphysics", logically posterior to his physics (48), and an unrevisable "divine metaphysics" -- a Lakatosian hard core, one might say. Where Stein had claimed that even Newton's theology could be regarded as empirical, since revelation can be regarded as a source of empirical knowledge (41), Janiak argues cogently that according to Newton's own warnings about "doing violence to the Scriptures", "scripture could not inform us of God's ubiquity in space", since Biblical descriptions of the Sun standing still etc. refer only to empirical measures of space and time, and not to the quantities being measured (157-161).

Having set up this division, Janiak devotes chapters 3 and 4 to Newton's "mundane metaphysics". Given the thesis that this is implicit in his established mathematical physics, this means that the discussion is conducted by reference chiefly to Newton's three laws of motion together with the inverse square law of gravitation. Again in chapter 5, Janiak relies on this distinction in his treatment of the discrepancy between Newton's upholding of the absoluteness of space in the Principia with his claim in the earlier manuscript De gravitatione that "it is not absolute in itself, but is as it were an emanative effect of God and an affection of every kind of being" (Newton 2004, 21). Janiak argues that the apparent discrepancy is dissolved when it is realized that the existence of absolute space cannot be established by the kind of physical arguments Newton brings to bear in De gravitatione; absolute space is rather to be regarded as belonging to the divine metaphysics.

Nowhere in any of this does Janiak discuss in any detail the emergence of Newton's mature views or their development from earlier positions. He gives what might be called an Athenian interpretation: Newton's natural philosophy is treated as born fully developed and implicit in his Laws. Janiak is silent on all those years Newton devoted to penetrating nature's secrets through his alchemical studies, and how these might have informed his experimental philosophy; there is nothing here on Newton's Arianism, his passion for Biblical chronology or other theological issues, despite the centrality of natural theology for the "divine metaphysics" that Janiak identifies. Of course, a fuller discussion of Newton's philosophy in historical context and its genesis from earlier views would have considerably complicated his argument, and Janiak can be excused for selecting an interesting subset of interrelated issues in Newton's natural philosophy -- although the positivistic framework he adopts implies rather that he regards such matters as pertaining to a context of discovery of subsidiary interest. Still, there are several instances where I believe Janiak's treatment of issues would have been considerably enhanced by a treatment of their genesis and/or historical context.

First, in a discussion of Newton's disavowal that he knows the cause of gravity, one cannot ignore Newton's other active principles, such as the active principles causing fermentation, the cohesion of bodies, and electric and magnetic attractions (Newton 2004, 137). It is surely of the greatest relevance to any discussion of Newton's attitude to mechanics that he held the mechanical behaviour of bodies to be governed by the "passive principle" of vis inertiae, and that he regarded this principle (and the three laws of motion based on it) as incapable either of putting bodies into motion or, now that they are in motion, of conserving them in it. (Query 31, Newton 2004, 135)

Janiak claims that in Newton's Definition 3 "he indicates that inertial mass is a measure of a body's resistance to acceleration" (105, 95). What one reads there is rather that "Inherent force of matter is the power of resisting by which every body, so far as it is able, perseveres in its state either of resting or of moving uniformly straight forward" (Newton 1999, 404). There is no mention here of acceleration, nor of a straightforward equivalence of this vis insita to mass. In the gloss Newton explains how a body exerts its force of inertia only during a change of its state, and this is a significant advance on prior conceptions of inertia. But we do not here have the conception of inertial mass as the proportionality constant between force and acceleration that it becomes in eighteenth century "Newtonian" physics. Janiak appeals to Newton's explicit statements that mass is proportional to weight, and points out that this runs directly counter to Cartesian physics (105). Indeed, but as he himself admits, Newton's introduction of mass did not provoke a whimper of protest from any of his contemporaries, so this would seem to indicate that what is required is a much fuller examination of Newton's ontology of force and inertia in relation to the views of his contemporaries, and not just Descartes.

Concerning mass, it is worth noting that Newton was able to draw from a thriving atomist tradition in the seventeenth century which did not (like Descartes) equate it with "bulk". For example, Descartes's mentor Isaac Beeckman had a conception of quantity of matter, distinct from quantity of empty space, which he called "corporeity" [corporeitas]. If one presumes, as Beeckman appears to have done, that all atoms are of the same density and empty space has zero density, then corporeity can just be taken to be quantity of matter ("amplitude of presence"?), and can be quantified in terms of what proportion of space is occupied as opposed to empty. This is surely of relevance to Newton's conception of mass, and gives a different way of conceiving it to the interpretation Janiak develops, where it is considered as an essential property of matter.

Given Newton's frequent favourable references to the atomist tradition, one might add, this is a topic in his natural philosophy deserving a full discussion in its own right. It would have been illuminating to have set what Janiak sees as an agnosticism about atomism (108) in the context of Newton's earlier embracing of Epicurean atomism detailed by McGuire, and his later discussions of prisca sapientia, where atomism is supposed to have been part of the ancient philosophy.

The ontology of force in the seventeenth century is, of course, a hugely complex affair, as witnessed by Westfall in Force in Newton's Physics (1971) -- a work that is in need of updating in the light of the studies of the development of the concept from Newton's early work through the drafts of De motu to the Principia by De Gandt, Brackenridge, and others. Janiak alludes to some of this work, but devotes only five and a half pages (81-86) to the issue of the ontology of forces in general. His main line is how crucial it is that forces can be measured. "Hence under certain conditions, the answer to the question -- what is the ontology of force? -- is simple: a quantity" (82). But although Janiak is surely right to stress Newton's innovation in always striving to quantify the concepts of his metaphysics, in fact there is nothing simple about the notion of a mathematical quantity. Isaac Barrow had given a nominalistic account of quantity, with which Newton's Neoplatonistic conception is at odds; and the nature of quantity is a contested issue in the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence.

This in turn suggests the importance of issues in the philosophy of mathematics. Guicciardini has traced Newton's development from being one of the foremost exponents of the new algebraic methods, through a growing disenchantment with the new analysis, to becoming one of its most hostile critics by the 1680s. This is undoubtedly a significant factor in turning Newton against Descartes, and presumably not irrelevant to his violent change of attitude towards Descartes's vortex theory and his ensuing trenchant criticisms of the Cartesian philosophy of motion in De gravitatione.

The discussion of Newton's emanation theory (139-150) is interesting, but again it would have been enhanced by a broader discussion of the notion of emanation (as well as the term "affection") in the seventeenth century. Newton is evidently indebted to More and the neo-Platonist tradition, but other modern thinkers as different from Newton as Sennert and Leibniz also entertained notions of "emanation". It does not seem likely that Newton would give the word an entirely new meaning and risk being misunderstood.

Similarly, a full discussion of Newton's views on absolute space and time cries out for a comparison with the views of Gassendi and Barrow, in particular, from whom the terminology derives. The argument for the reality of motion from the phenomenon of centrifugal force may be found in Barrow's lectures, and some of Newton's formulations are virtual paraphrases of Charleton, who in turn was paraphrasing Gassendi. Again, a discussion of Huygens and the equation of time is of the utmost relevance to Newton's development of the concept of absolute time, and the link between physics and metaphysics; but Newton's philosophy of time is not discussed at all in this book.

In sum, this is a very competent book, and makes an important contribution within the field of study for which it is intended. But it treats a very delimited part of Newton's philosophy, albeit a crucial part, from a narrow methodological perspective, and the author would have been better advised to have presented it accordingly.


Burtt, Edwin A. (1925). The Metaphysical Foundations of Modern Physical Science. New York, Doubleday.

Newton, Isaac (1999). The Principia. Transl. I. Bernard Cohen and Anne Whitman. Berkeley: University of California Press.

Newton, Isaac (2004). Philosophical Writings. Ed. Andrew Janiak. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Thayer, H.S., ed. (1953). Newton's Philosophy of Nature. N.Y.: Hafner, Macmillan.

Stein, Howard (1970). "Newtonian Space-Time" in Rober Palter (ed.), The Annus Mirabilis of Sir Isaac Newton (1666-1966). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Westfall, Richard S. (1971). Force in Newton's Physics. New York: Macdonald.