Nicomachean Ethics

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Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, C. D. C. Reeve (tr.), Hackett, 2014, lvi + 447pp., $19.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781624661174.

Reviewed by Lawrence Jost, University of Cincinnati


F. A. Trendelenburg, the 19th C. German philologist and idealist philosopher[1], insisted that the best and safest way to interpret a text of Aristotle's was to rely on other texts attributed to him: "Aristoteles ex Aristotele" was his dictum, and this approach to studying the Metaphysics was explicitly endorsed and employed by Joseph Owens in his influential The Doctrine of Being in the Aristotelian Metaphysics. C. D. C. Reeve's new translation of the Nicomachean Ethics is most succinctly characterized as applying Trendelenburg's dictum to this work with a relentless consistency. For, in his 160 pages of notes to his translation, numbered consecutively from 1-898, we are referred profusely to a wide range of other passages in Aristotle's works, from other ethical works, of course, but also to his rhetorical, political, psychological, biological, logical, and metaphysical writings, often with rather lengthy excerpts provided. These internal references are explicitly claimed at p. xiii to be a suitable substitute for "extensive annotation and commentary", a practice clearly at work in Terence Irwin's previous Hackett translation, where.Irwin's notes quite often offer concise but penetrating analyses of the arguments of the NE that raise objections and clarifications, always with an eye on the course of the over-all argument and the difficulty of understanding key passages. Readers of Reeve's earlier translations of both Platonic and Aristotelian texts will have high expectations for this latest entry in what seems a never-ending stream of new translations of the NE, and I assume that this one is meant in some way to replace Irwin's earlier and widely used 2nd ed. from 1999. As Hackett has served our discipline so well for so many years with valuable and reasonably priced editions, Reeve's latest effort will be understandably welcomed by most, if not all.

Reeve has chosen, in contrast with Irwin, to argue for his own interpretation in a lengthy introduction that incorporates a good deal of the claims he has defended in recent years in two books on Aristotle's ethics published by Harvard University Press.[2] A key feature of Reeve's approach is his universalist as opposed to particularist reading of the practical sciences of ethics and politics: "scientific knowledge of universals is a crucial part of politics. . . . it [politics] is something like an applied science as opposed to a pure one" (p. xxvi). Politics' "universalist component" is "legislative science", the aim of which is to "produce a set of universal laws" that will make citizens good by habituating them to virtuous conduct through educational arrangements (p. xxvii) designed to do the "heavy lifting of the Ethics' practicality" (p. xxix). Ethics and politics, then, have "explanatory foundations of their own" and, while respecting the "empirical foundations" of the theoretical sciences, practical sciences "are not committed to them as fixed points of [their] own explanatory enterprise. . . . Biology, metaphysics, and other bodies of knowledge have no foundational role in politics whatsoever" (p. xxxvi). There follows an extensive and very helpful discussion of the role of dialectic in the process of sifting through the "reputable opinions " (endoxa) and the puzzles they raise that are so often encountered in the detailed discussions we find in the NE. There is not space here to critically evaluate Reeve's main substantive contentions, but his introduction is definitely not a simple diachronic summary of the contents of the NE. He has opted, instead, for a concise overview of his general understanding of the "philosophy of human affairs" (1181b15); those unfamiliar with his previous scholarship in this area will find the introduction incisive and informative.

Cross-references to the NE itself are carefully marked, and the fairly frequent allusions to Homer, pre-Socratics, Plato, Greek tragedians, poets, and historians can be found throughout the valuable notes. Occasionally our attention is drawn to some potentially controversial passages whose interpretation has divided commentators for centuries, whether these are due to possible ambiguity in the Greek, variant readings in our manuscripts, or potential inconsistency with other Aristotelian texts. In addition, the notes are invaluable for clarifying unfamiliar Greek practices such as the private funding by rich Athenians of public goods, for example, temples, triremes, and dramatic festivals. Reeve's notes also indicate where he has departed from Ingram Bywater's still reigning 1894 OCT.

A very carefully constructed index is provided, with all references of key words in the text duly noted and partially quoted, with their Greek equivalents supplied in parentheses next to their English translations. Reeve's index thus forms a glossary of sorts, but not one as analytically helpful as that found in Irwin, in spite of its very full listings. Instructors will have to help their students pore through these citations and indicate where the usage seems importantly different. To take one example, where Reeve duly provides dozens of occurrences of 'kalon' or 'noble', Irwin's glossary entry on "fine, beautiful, kalos" distinguishes aesthetic uses from ethical ones, broader from narrower uses, how "acting for the sake of the fine" differs from compulsive or merely instrumental activity, and so on. Irwin supplies Bekker-style references to particular passages but groups them according to their distinctive employments, thus guiding the reader who might otherwise be at a loss to see how all the many passages employing the same term can seem to have different meanings/uses.

Reeve's suggestions for further reading are rather sparse, amounting to two pages or so, compared to Irwin's topically arranged six. If the publisher in this case intends to replace the widely used 2nd ed. of Irwin with this work, it is important for those of us assigning texts to our students to know what we gain and lose if we switch to Reeve in the way of supplementary material. My guess is that although there is some concern that Irwin at times pushes us toward a view of the text that he endorses and others might quibble with, Reeve appears to me to leave both student and instructor alike to do their own sorting and classifying. Depending on the sophistication of such readers, the sheer abundance of citations in the index might well remind them of passages they may have forgotten and should recall, but does not assist them in their own process. In the hands of a very knowing instructor the fact that the data are there leaves plenty of room for her or his guidance since the interpretative dice are not loaded, as it were. Still, especially for those new to the text, there is a danger that they will be overwhelmed and discouraged by all the information abundantly on offer in both the notes and index.

Of course, the crucial question in choosing a translation is how accessible it will be to Greek-less readers as well as to those coming to the Ethics for the first time. Their needs are admirably met in my opinion by Roger Crisp's Cambridge University edition, especially now that the 2014 revised edition has supplied line numbers in the margins as well as the page and column numbers of the 2000 original. (Reeve chooses to mark line numbers within the body of the text itself, a practice I find less easy to follow than marginal indications, such as are found in both Irwin and Crisp. Bekker page and column letters are found at the top of each page, but one has to strain a bit to spot changes from one page or column to another on individual pages.)

The best way to illustrate the differences between various translations is to exhibit selected portions and compare them, not just to the Greek original but also to each other as to diction, ease of comprehension and so on. Here my impression is that Reeve has clung closely to the original Greek phrasing, but not slavishly so, sometimes making the English result hard to take in without knowledge of Greek itself, although it can't be said that he has been excessively literal, just a mite less free than he could have been. A significant and familiar methodological recommendation made at the start of the discussion of akrasia[3] in Book VII (1145b2-7) is rendered as follows by each translator:

Irwin: "As in the other cases, we must set out the appearances, and first of all go through the puzzles. In this way we must prove the common beliefs about these ways of being affected -- ideally, all the common beliefs, but, if not all, most of them and the most important. For if the objections are solved, and the common beliefs are left, it will be an adequate proof."

Crisp: "As in our other discussions, we must first set out the way things appear to people, and then, having gone through the puzzles, proceed to prove the received opinions about these ways of being affected -- at best, all of them, or, failing that, most, and the most authoritative. For if the problems are resolved, and received opinions remain, we shall have offered sufficient proof."

Reeve: "We must, as in other cases, set out the things that appear to be so and first go through the puzzles, and in that way show preferably all the reputable beliefs about these ways of being affected, or if not all of them then most of them, and the ones with the most control. For if the objections are resolved and the reputable beliefs are left standing, that would be an adequate showing."

While Reeve's 'reputable opinions' for 'endoxa' is preferable to Irwin's 'common beliefs' or (arguably) to Crisp's 'received opinions' for reasons best laid out by Jonathan Barnes some years ago, I submit that Reeve's expression 'the ones with the most control' is clumsy in comparison with either 'the most important' or 'the most authoritative', even if it corresponds more closely to the literal meaning of 'kuriotata' in the Greek. Similarly, 'adequate proof' and 'sufficient proof' strike me as more natural than 'an adequate showing'. I assume that Reeve resists 'proof' since it might suggest the strong notion of demonstration (apodeixis) 0found in the Analytics, perhaps, and to be consistent with other occurrences of the verb in our text that he translates as 'show' (deiknunai), all listed in the index. This strikes me as an unnecessary bow to rigid consistency, since readers were warned early on in I.3 of the inexact nature of most arguments in practical science, and Reeve's note 23 differentiates very nicely the merely persuasive argumentation rhetoricians employ by contrast with demonstrations proper that mathematicians should provide. These are, to be sure, minor quibbles, and Reeve's translation is for the most part smooth and always faithful to the Greek, including those pesky particles that provide shading and nuance in Aristotle's often crabbed and gnarly prose (as in, e.g., the opening lines of 1.10.1100a10-14).

At times the prose is uplifting, even graceful, as in X.8.1178b8-16:

The gods, in fact, we suppose to be the most blessed and happy of all. But what sorts of actions should we assign to them? Just ones? Won't they appear ridiculous if they engage in transactions, return deposits, and so on? Courageous ones, then, enduring what is frightening and facing danger because it is the noble thing to do? Or generous ones? To whom will they give? It will be a strange thing, if they actually have money or anything like that. And their temperate actions, what would they be? Or isn't the praise vulgar, since they do not have base appetites?

Occasionally, however, fidelity seems to this reader to get in the way of readability, at least when compared with Crisp's renditions. Consider, for example, the second paragraph of the first chapter of Book V, viz. 1129a6-11:

Reeve: "We see, then, that what everyone means to say about justice is that it is the sort of state from which people are doers of just things -- that is, from which they do just actions and wish for what is just. It is the same way where injustice is concerned -- it is the state from which people do injustice and wish for what is unjust. That is why the first thing we should do in our outline is to assume these things."

Crisp: "We see that everyone means by justice the same kind of state, namely, that which disposes people to do just actions, act justly, and wish for what is just. In the same way, by injustice they mean the state that makes people act unjustly and wish for what is unjust. So let us too begin with these assumptions as a rough basis for our discussion."

Crisp's wording strikes me as easier to digest and yet not unfaithful to the original.

The general lesson I draw from comparing Reeve with both Irwin and Crisp is perhaps best expressed in terms of the level of the class in which one wants to use a translation of the whole of the NE. One familiar use is in an introductory ethics course using whole classical texts where one might well want Aristotle along with Mill's Utilitarianism and Kant's Groundwork. In such a course I think that Crisp would be most helpful to beginners, given the relatively smoother and more accessible translation he offers with a modicum of supplementary material; his introduction is more an overview of coming attractions rather than offering a potentially controversial interpretation, and his glossary is short and the index similarly restrained. For more advanced students, especially those who have already had at least one survey of ancient philosophy or, better, a course on Aristotle with emphasis on the theoretical sciences, Reeve would serve very well. He confines his interpretation primarily to his introduction, translates for the most part in a clear and consistent fashion, with very helpful notes as described above and an index that is thorough and well-nigh complete. Though daunting data-wise, and requiring the guidance of a well-versed instructor, Reeve's new offering has much to recommend it. Irwin's 2nd ed. is still very useful for such mid-level students and even for advanced undergraduates. While I have found it very helpful for graduate students as well, there is much to be said for the 2002 Oxford translation by Christopher Rowe with its lengthy "philosophical introduction" by Sarah Broadie, which runs some 80 pages and whose commentary of almost 200 pages contains much insight into this challenging and enduring monument. Finally, it might be said that we have a number of very valuable translations of the NE not touched on here, ranging from various hands revising W. D. Ross' 1925 version over the years, to others having various virtues as well as defects, and this abundance of riches is not at all diminished by yet another offering, this one at the hands of a seasoned and devoted student of the "master of those who know". I recommend Reeve, then, with the few reservations noted above. For those of us who love this text, yet another attempt to capture it for a modern audience is most welcome.

[1] On Trendelenburg see F. C. Beiser’s Late German Idealism: Trendelenburg and Lotze recently reviewed in NDPR.

[2] Action, Contemplation, and Happiness (2012); Aristotle on Practical Wisdom: Nicomachean Ethics VI (2013). With his 1992 Practices of Reason (Oxford University Press) we now have a trilogy of penetrating works on this most important text.

[3] Instead of using the misleading (to modern ears) 'incontinence' (as do Irwin, Crisp and many others), Reeve chooses to translate the positive trait-noun 'enkrateia' by 'self-control', thus making its privative counterpart 'lack of self-control'.