Nietzsche and Morality

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Brian Leiter and Neil Sinhababu (eds.), Nietzsche and Morality, Oxford University Press, 2007, 320pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199285938.

Reviewed by Scott Jenkins, University of Kansas


This collection of essays contains some of the best recent work on Nietzsche and moral philosophy.  The editors state that their aim is to present work that advances the understanding of Nietzsche's ethical views and demonstrates the relevance of those views to contemporary debates in normative ethics, metaethics, and moral psychology.  In relation to these two ends, the collection is clearly a success.  It presents very good historical scholarship as well as some first-rate work in moral philosophy that engages with the issues that concerned Nietzsche.  Some essays are focused quite narrowly on topics in Nietzsche's writings while others spend less time on exegetical issues in order to examine in more detail Nietzsche's often-overlooked contributions to central questions in moral philosophy.  The collection will certainly be of interest to moral philosophers and to those interested in the history of modern philosophy, and many of the essays should be regarded as essential reading for anyone interested in Nietzsche's engagement with morality.

The first essay in the collection, Thomas Hurka's "Nietzsche: Perfectionist," portrays Nietzsche not simply as a philosopher who can be of use to the contemporary moral theorist but as himself a moral theorist with a moral view of his own.  According to Hurka, Nietzsche is a perfectionist of a particular type, an advocate of a maximax theory that requires all agents to act in such a way that the perfection of the most exceptional agents is maximized.  This is a consequentialist theory according to which all agents have the same moral goal, but different duties (depending, of course, upon the potential of the agent in question).  Hurka recognizes that by attributing non-egoistic moral duties to unexceptional agents his reading of Nietzsche conflicts with the commonly-held view of Nietzsche as an ethical egoist, and he presents a compelling argument for regarding Nietzsche as advocating egoism only to the exceptional.  Less convincing is his claim that Nietzsche's remarks on aristocracy and nobility should be regarded as outlining a moral duty of the unexceptional to sacrifice their well-being for the good of the exceptional.  Nietzsche's characterization of the egoism of a noble soul as an "unshakeable faith" that others must be sacrificed (Beyond Good and Evil [BGE] 265), for example, strikes me not as the articulation of such a duty but instead as an attempt to connect a good conscience with the latent aristocratic tendencies in his readers.  Nevertheless, the essay has much to offer concerning Nietzsche's understanding of the states of a person he regards as worth cultivating.  Nietzsche's understanding of perfection is, Hurka argues, a formal one that regards a particular relation among an agent's goals as constitutive of perfection.  In addition, Hurka demonstrates that unlike many perfectionists, Nietzsche acknowledges the empirical fact that perfection requires both the sacrifice of other goods, such as pleasure, and the overcoming of inner impulses that direct us away from perfection.  The recognition of such impulses strikes Hurka as incompatible with Nietzsche's attempt to explain all action through appeal to a will to power.  On this view, we must choose between Nietzsche's substantive ethics and his theory of will to power.

In "The Will to Power and the Ethics of Creativity" Bernard Reginster presents a very different account of the relation between Nietzsche's moral psychology and his ethical thought.  Reginster argues that Nietzsche's emphasis on the value of creativity ought to be regarded as a consequence of his theory of the will to power, which he understands not as a desire to dominate and control but rather as a second-order desire for "the overcoming of resistance in the pursuit of some determinate first-order desire" (37).  Reginster demonstrates that this view of the will to power squares with a number of important passages, but I find it troubling that this approach requires us to understand power as a kind of activity.  If Nietzsche had this view in mind, why would he use the term 'power' ('Macht'), which commonly designates a capacity?  Reginster's approach can explain Nietzsche's praise of creativity; the activity of overcoming resistance is common to work in Nietzsche's preferred fields of philosophy and the arts.  But as Reginster himself points out, it is also common to activities that are frivolous, or depraved.  For this reason he maintains that Nietzsche's ethics of creativity should be understood as consisting of two claims: that the difficulty of a valuable achievement contributes to its value, and that extreme difficulty is necessary for the greatness of an achievement.  This view leaves open the question of which achievements are valuable, or which first-order ends are worth pursuing.  It could even be the case that no ends are worth pursing -- Reginster's Nietzsche takes no stand on this question.  Thus I find the ethics of creativity that follows from this approach to the will to power to be a rather odd form of ethics.

Mathias Risse's "Nietzschean 'Animal Psychology' versus Kantian Ethics" presents a Nietzschean critique of Kantian ethics, especially as it appears in Christine Korsgaard's work.  Risse argues that the Kantian appeal to the reflective nature of the first-person viewpoint does not ensure that third-personal psychological inquiries, of the sort found in Nietzsche, are irrelevant to questions of moral obligation.  He then argues that this critique of Kant's notion of willing requires us to adopt quite different, Nietzschean notions of freedom and of the unity of agency.  While the essay has much to offer those interested in the Kant-Nietzsche relation, I will focus on just one central claim, that Nietzsche's third-personal 'animal psychology' is relevant to the Kantian's project since it has the potential to demonstrate that the will, understood as a single entity detached from desires, simply does not exist.  Risse seems to construe Kant's ethics as resting on an empirical claim justified through inner cognition; he states that "agents perceive themselves as making choices" (64) and that we "perceive ourselves as taking the standpoint of deliberative detachment" (67).  Thus it is no surprise that he finds Nietzsche's investigations into the role played by desires, drives, and wills in decision-making to have the capacity to undermine Kant's view of willing.  The Kantian's best response, I think, is to deny that her notion of deliberation is grounded in inner cognition.  The point of emphasizing that freedom is an idea, and that we can act "only under the idea of freedom," is precisely to deny that a free will is a possible object of inner cognition.  In assuming that Kant affirms this claim, Risse misconstrues the Kantian's position.

Joshua Knobe and Brian Leiter present a quite different Nietzschean critique of traditional moral thought in their essay, "The Case of Nietzschean Moral Psychology."  Their goal is to demonstrate that Nietzsche's views in moral psychology receive much more support from recent work in empirical psychology than do those of the Kantian or Aristotelian.  Knobe and Leiter examine a wide range of  psychological studies (including studies of twins' behavior, the effects of child-rearing practices on personality, and the relation between moral behavior and reports of moral attitudes) and argue that a person's behavior in moral contexts can be explained primarily through appeal to heritable "type-facts," while moral upbringing (the Aristotelian view) and conscious decision-making (the Kantian view) quite surprisingly play almost no role in such explanations.  This empirical evidence, they argue, demonstrates that Nietzsche's theory of different psychological types, with their characteristic moral and theoretical commitments, at the very least deserves serious attention from philosophers interested in moral psychology. Knobe and Leiter do a very good job of making their case, and their work suggests an interesting question concerning Nietzsche's work -- How, exactly, did he arrive at a theory that is confirmed by recent empirical investigations if not by way of considering the data that support the theory?

R. Jay Wallace's contribution, "Ressentiment, Value, and Self-Vindication: Making Sense of Nietzsche's Slave Revolt," considers the relation between the psychological state of ressentiment and the slave values that it generates.  Wallace argues that the "strategic" reading of Genealogy of Morals [GM] I, which regards the construction of these values by the weak slaves as a conscious act of revenge against the powerful, motivated by the desire to harm characteristic of ressentiment, saddles Nietzsche with an implausible account of the creativity of psychological states.  In its place Wallace offers an "expressive interpretation" of the relation Nietzsche postulates between emotions and values.  On this view, the weak adopt the values good and evil in order to reconcile the hatred they feel toward the successful members of society with the judgment that precisely these people are good, and thus worthy of admiration.  The mechanism of adoption is an unconscious drive to psychic harmony that is satisfied, in this particular case, by a value schema that justifies the emotions of the slaves.  Wallace demonstrates that this interpretation of the slave revolt is consistent with Nietzsche's claims that the priestly masters actually create these new values (GM I:7, BGE 261), but Wallace also seems to prefer the more properly expressive view that a state such as ressentiment not only explains the adoption of particular values but also plays a role in the emergence of such values.  Nevertheless, Wallace's interpretation both fits Nietzsche's text and points to a variety of compelling questions concerning the relation between emotional states and ethical evaluation.  He makes an excellent case for the depth and contemporary relevance of Nietzsche's moral psychology.

The final essay concerned with moral psychology, Christopher Janaway's "Guilt, Bad Conscience, and Self-punishment in Nietzsche's Genealogy," examines one of Nietzsche's more radical psychological claims -- that human beings have a distinctive propensity to cruelty.  Janaway reads Genealogy II as an account of how the feeling of guilt, understood as a kind of self-punishment warranted by an awareness that our bodily drives are evil, actually functions in service of those same drives.  In particular, he argues that our drive to cruelty finds its expression in the painful awareness of oneself as a guilty sinner.  Janaway's analysis has the advantage of bringing some degree of unity to the disparate themes Nietzsche considers in the second and third essays of the Genealogy.  A central claim of Genealogy III is that ascetic beliefs and practices cannot be essentially opposed to our natural drives, as they appear to be, but must instead be understood as functioning in service of life (GM III:13).  On Janaway's reading of Genealogy II, guilt is the same basic kind of phenomenon as ascetic practice -- an aberrant, distinctively social expression of a natural drive.  Janaway does not examine these larger issues associated with Nietzsche's naturalism, though he does hint at them in a concluding remark concerning Beyond Good and Evil 2.  He does provide a careful, detailed analysis of Genealogy II in support of regarding the drive to cruelty as the key to understanding the bewildering array of concepts and arguments Nietzsche presents.  His analysis is almost always convincing, though it leaves open the question of how, exactly, the restrictions of society bring about a redirection of the drive to cruelty.

The section on metaethics begins with Nadeem Hussain's "Honest Illusion: Valuing for Nietzsche's Free Spirits," an essay that has already received some critical attention in the work of Anderson, Reginster, and Richardson.  Hussain argues that Nietzsche urges his free spirits to engage in a "fictionalist simulacrum" of valuing, in which a subject regards a state of affairs as valuable in itself while he, at the same time, knows that nothing is valuable in itself.  On this reading, Nietzsche sees art as providing us with a model for coming to occupy such a state (though Hussain's discussion of "honest illusions" in the arts stops short of providing the details of such an account).  While I agree with Hussain that the idea of such "honest illusions" makes sense of a number of remarks in the Gay Science [GS], I do not find this fictionalism compatible with Nietzsche's later discussions of value and valuing, in which Nietzsche rarely praises illusion of any sort.  So why does Hussain read Nietzsche as a fictionalist?  It might be that he has an independent commitment to fictionalism that colors his reading of Nietzsche.  Within this essay the driving force seems to be the assumption that Nietzsche is a radical nihilist about value who takes all evaluative judgments to be false.  The textual evidence offered for this claim comes from just two passages in Human, All Too Human, so it seems to me that we would do better to retain a realist reading of Nietzsche's frequent talk of values and valuing (one that still denies that anything is valuable in itself) and give up Hussain's reading of these passages from Human, All Too Human.

Maudemarie Clark and David Dudrick take a different tack in their "Nietzsche and Moral Objectivity: The Development of Nietzsche's Metaethics."  While they also read Human, All Too Human as expressing a radically nihilistic view about value, they maintain that in the Gay Science Nietzsche embraces a non-cognitivism that is compatible with the objectivity of some evaluative positions.  The view is non-cognitivist insofar as it regards evaluative claims as expressions of commitments to norms governing certain acts and attitudes.  It retains objectivity since we can understand judgments of the objectivity of evaluative claims as themselves expressions of commitments to norms of a different sort.  While such metaethical views clearly have their merits, I find Clark and Dudrick's attribution of such a view to Nietzsche unconvincing.  Their argument depends upon a creative reading of the opening sections of the Gay Science that attributes to Nietzsche a great concern with the activity of giving reasons for or against particular acts and attitudes.  While they are aware that their approach is non-standard, their defense of the reading depends upon an implausible identification of the activity of teaching a purpose for existence (GS 1) with that of giving reasons for beliefs (GS 2) (209, 210).  In addition, Clark and Dudrick's argument against taking Nietzsche to be a "subjective realist" -- a cognitivist who regards the value of objects as deriving from some state of the subject -- is much too brief to be convincing (205).

Peter Poellner's "Affect, Value, and Objectivity" argues that Nietzsche is, in fact, a realist of this sort.  Poellner maintains that while Nietzsche clearly does not think that values are metaphysically real, he also recognizes that our everyday experience is of entities that are valuable in one way or another (e.g. beautiful, elegant, courageous) and seeks to explain this "phenomenal objectivity" through appeal to our affects.  This general approach to Nietzsche's metaethics is, to my mind, the only one compatible with Nietzsche's claim in GS 301 that while nothing in the world has value "in itself [an sich], according to its nature," some things do indeed have value in virtue of our having given them value "as a gift [geschenkt]."  Poellner's detailed account of how emotions present objects to us as having value-properties, thus giving those objects the 'gift' of value, is both sensitive to the subtleties of Nietzsche's writings and informed by recent work in metaethics.  I have just one worry concerning Poellner's position.  In appealing to the notion of an adequate presentation of an entity in his account of the veridicality of some affective responses, he seems to take for granted that a strong aversion to deception is constitutive of adequate presentation (247).  But Nietzsche's remarks on truthfulness can be seen as calling into question our right to regard such an aversion as constitutive of a proper point of view.  This assumption could also be in tension with Poellner's concluding remarks on the will to truth.

Neil Sinhababu's "Vengeful Thinking and Moral Epistemology" is concerned with showing that Nietzschean claims concerning the origin of distinctively moral beliefs can serve as premises in two different arguments for the conclusion that beliefs in the existence of moral properties are unjustified.  He maintains that if the best explanation of a person's having such a belief does not make mention of moral properties of acts, we have the most important premise of Gilbert Harman's argument in "Ethics and Observation."  He also asserts that if it can be established that distinctively moral beliefs arise in subjects by way of an unreliable mechanism, knowledge of this fact undermines a person's justification.  Sinhababu then argues that the first essay of the Genealogy provides us with the outlines of an explanation of moral beliefs that makes no mention of moral facts and appeals instead to unreliable psychological mechanisms and the historical transmission of belief.  The essay succeeds in demonstrating the contemporary relevance of Nietzsche's concerns and the philosophical importance of the second argument against moral realism, but it does not devote much attention to the question of whether Nietzsche's claims in Genealogy I are correct.  For this reason, Sinhababu's conclusions concerning Nietzsche's work tend to take the conditional form "If Nietzsche was right, then…"

The collection concludes with an essay by Simon Blackburn, "Perspectives, Fictions, Errors, Play," which is less concerned with providing a reading of Nietzsche than it is with considering the merits of these four generally Nietzschean ethical notions.  Blackburn argues that the error theorist is simply mistaken in thinking that ethical judgments require metaphysical grounding.  If Nietzsche held such a wrongheaded view, Blackburn asserts, he would quite surprisingly be laboring under the same misunderstanding of ethics characteristic of the Platonist.  The fictionalist, on the other hand, is judged to be incapable of providing the kind of critique of Christian morality that Nietzsche sought.  Thus Blackburn concludes that fictionalism cannot play a role in Nietzsche's central project, the construction of "a better morality" that would replace the Christian morality dominant in his time (296).  Blackburn does find Nietzsche's talk of perspectives useful in understanding the nature and importance of moral disagreement, but he thinks that a confrontation between perspectives cannot be understood as a form of play: "a life of play has to be a life without needs and without unconditional commitments.  But this is unrecognizable as a human life, and only even works as an ideal so long as it is not thought through" (294).  Blackburn appears to assume that if a person can opt out of any commitment (as one surely can in the context of a game simply by refusing to continue to play), then nothing truly matters to that person and we cannot regard him as possessing an ethical code of any kind.  Nietzsche's thought could be, however, that if we continue to regard all playful or gay attitudes toward our values as incompatible with caring about them, as indicating that it is all "just a game," the ethical progress that Blackburn envisions will proceed much more slowly.  In opposition to Blackburn, Nietzsche might regard a certain kind of lightheartedness as a condition of taking some ethical matters seriously (compare GS 327).

Considered together these essays make an excellent case for Nietzsche's importance for contemporary moral philosophy.  They present Nietzsche as an insightful, subtle philosopher and ethical theorist with strikingly original views, a figure very different from the bombastic immoralist he is often taken to be.  Some important topics do appear only in passing.  The first to come to mind are Nietzsche's emphasis on the importance of the notion of custom for understanding morality and his claim that morality could be in the process of coming to an end.  In addition, the reader gets little sense that Nietzsche regarded philosophical engagement with morality as dangerous but necessary -- an activity with unpredictable results that could nevertheless serve as a means of avoiding the nihilistic stasis characteristic of Zarathustra's "last man."  Of course this is no criticism of the collection; it does not aim to provide a complete picture of Nietzsche's views on morality.  The fact that this collection demonstrates the need for further engagement with Nietzsche should be regarded as a sign of its success.