Nietzsche and the Ancient Skeptical Tradition

Placeholder book cover

Jessica N. Berry, Nietzsche and the Ancient Skeptical Tradition, Oxford University Press, 2011, 230pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195368420.

Reviewed by Beatrix Himmelmann, University of Tromsø (Norway)


When writing on a figure like Nietzsche, a figure attracting wide attention and receiving diverse interpretation, many authors begin by ensuring that they are able to offer an exciting new way of understanding. Few, however, succeed in really doing so. Jessica Berry's book does, in fact, inspire rethinking the big questions Nietzsche poses. It is true that the idea that Nietzsche, somehow, embraces skepticism is widespread. He is known to be abundantly critical about most of the claims presented by the most influential philosophers -- philosophers whose legacy still is and, probably, will continue to be an important stimulus for philosophical debates in a variety of fields. Nietzsche takes pride in portraying himself as a "tempter" (Versucher), "digging, mining, undermining" (Daybreak, Preface 1). In his late self-image Ecce Homo he famously declares: "Ich bin kein Mensch, ich bin Dynamit." ("I am not a man, I am dynamite.")

Berry clears the diffuse picture of Nietzsche's skepticism. She identifies a specific tradition of skepticism to which Nietzsche owes quite a bit and which might, accordingly, contribute to explaining his key projects. Even though Nietzsche refers to Descartes explicitly when he publishes the first edition of Human, All too Human (HH, Instead of a Preface) in 1878 and alludes to Hume's skeptical objections throughout his works, it is not a strain of modern skepticism that he takes up. As Berry points out, ancient skepticism, namely Pyrrhonism, provided Nietzsche with a pattern of argumentation to which he felt akin. Cartesian doubt is methodic doubt, i.e., it is employed in order to arrive finally at some kind of certainty. In a fragment from 1885 (KSA 11: 632), Nietzsche states that, for this reason, Descartes is not radical enough. Descartes strives for certainty and does not want to be deceived. "Why not?" asks Nietzsche. Being disinterested in certainty, however, distinguishes Pyrrhonian skeptics. In contrast to another group of ancient skeptics, the Academic, they do not claim to know that things are, by their nature, inapprehensible. Consequently, Pyrrhonian skeptics are not in danger of turning into negative dogmatists. They are not tempted to fall victim to the one flaw all sorts of dogmatists share: a preference for ceasing investigation altogether because of the conviction that ultimate insight into the structure of things has been achieved. Pyrrhonists, instead, seek to continue investigation through epochē, suspension of judgment by means of opposing arguments and appearances against each other in any way whatsoever -- hoping to achieve equipollence (isostheneia) of the objects and reasons thus opposed.

From all of this, it should be fairly plausible that Nietzsche must have been attracted by the tradition of Pyrrhonian skepticism. Berry shows (pp. 25-33) that he was well acquainted with the major sources from which we know about Pyrrhonism: the writings of Sextus Empiricus, in particular his Outlines of Skepticism, and Diogenes Laertius' Lives and Opinions of Eminent Philosophers. That the latter is of great importance to Nietzsche is obvious and has often been noticed; it is less known that Nietzsche dealt with Sextus not only in connection with his early philological studies on Diogenes but also when he was working on Democritus. Sextus presents and discusses Democritus' positions. Berry also mentions (pp. 28-29) Victor Brochard's seminal work Les Sceptiques Grecs (1887), a copy of which Nietzsche acquired almost immediately upon its publication. He thoroughly studied the book; notebook entries indicate the intensity of his concern (KSA 13: 264ff). In Ecce Homo ('Clever' 3) he explicitly praises Brochard's study.

Yet what Berry means to demonstrate when she claims that ancient skepticism exerted a vivid influence on Nietzsche amounts, of course, to more than verifying relevant reading. Her aim is ambitious, and she carefully lays out five criteria that need to be met in order to validate any talk of philosophical influence of A on B: (1) there should be a genuine similarity between the doctrines of A and B; (2) that B could not have found the relevant doctrine in any writer other than A; (3) the probability of the similarity being random should be very low; (4) adopting the methods or conclusions of A would further the philosophical purposes of B; (5) an influence of A on B should be asserted only where we come to understand B better by appreciating it (pp. 23-24). These criteria are very well suited to serve as a standard for testing Berry's discussion. The five issues she investigates in detail are well-chosen and crucial to Nietzsche's overall philosophical project. Let us have a closer look at them.

The investigation starts out with the problem of "truth and lie" (pp. 49-67) that occupied Nietzsche all through his career. Early on and most famously this topic is reflected in his essay On Truth and Lie in a Nonmoral Sense (TL) from 1873, which he never published. Berry concentrates on this text, taking it as a pivotal reference for "skepticism in Nietzsche's early work". She suggests understanding the essay as a piece of psychological inquiry, centered on Nietzsche's question: "Where in the world could the drive for truth have come from?" (TL 1) According to Berry, we should not try to search the text for rudiments of a "metaphysical or semantic theory of truth" (p. 52), as Maudemarie Clark and others notably do. On Truth and Lie belongs, argues Berry, to a series of early writings in which Nietzsche presents himself as "cultural physician" ("Arzt der Cultur"). Under this title he sought to frame the philosopher's task at that time (KSA 7: 545). What the philosopher as "cultural physician" should be able to diagnose -- and, maybe, to cure -- is what is behind that peculiar drive for truth, that quest for disclosure: a desire for stability, security, and control, yearning for the termination of investigation. This kind of coping with the problem of truth looks unhealthy and, in this sense, indeed 'nihilistic'. Yet dogmatists, due to their "conceit and rashness" (after a formulation of Sextus Empiricus), adhere to it. A sound approach to the question of truth would be aware of the mediating realm of symbolic forms, "metaphors", that man himself has erected in order to tame the world's lavishness. Truth, then, would not be confused with the idea of immediate access to the "essence" of things. Berry assumes that Nietzsche's essay is to be read as a "provocative challenge" (p. 52), pointing towards dogmatic misunderstanding of the concept of truth and suggesting a skeptical attitude of suspending judgment and instead allowing for uncertainty about the "nature" of things.

This interpretation makes good sense; but it remains silent about the fact that Nietzsche drew heavily on contemporary sources when he wrote On Truth and Lie[1], while there is no evidence of any specific interest in Sextus Empiricus during that period, as Berry, nonetheless, suggests. It is Hermann von Helmholtz's theory of "unconscious inference", spelled out in his Handbuch der physiologischen Optik (1867), that impressed Nietzsche, along with Johann Carl Friedrich Zöllner's comments on Helmholtz; and it is, particularly, Gustav Gerber's philosophy of language, laid out in Die Sprache als Kunst (1871), that left explicit traces in Nietzsche's essay.[2] All this indicates that Nietzsche paid close attention to theories of sensory perception and language as well as to questions about conscious and unconscious processes that might be involved in them. Obviously, he discusses the problem of "truth and lie" within this particular frame. It is unlikely, therefore, that Nietzsche should have referred to Sextus when pointing at the arbitrariness of noun gender, for instance (see p. 58), while we find relevant passages in Gerber[3] from whom Nietzsche picks up so many of the arguments and examples he presents in this unpublished essay that he "kept secret" (Human, All Too Human II, Preface 1). It is also Gerber's book together with the other sources mentioned that might provide some explanation of what we are to make of those "difficult" passages (p. 66) in which Nietzsche deals with "aesthetic relations" between the "absolutely different spheres" of an object and a subject, of a nerve stimulus, an image (a representation), and a sound (of language).

As a result of these observations, it seems to me that there is no need for an emphatically skeptical, i.e., Pyrrhonian, reading of the young Nietzsche's essay On Truth and Lie, all the more as art and the artist appear to take over the job of serving as "cultural physicians" (TL 2).

Let us turn now to the "question of Nietzsche's 'naturalism'" (pp. 68-103). Since it has become common practice, at least in Anglo-American Nietzsche scholarship, to see him as a "naturalist", it is a matter of vital interest to discuss the relationship between Nietzsche's "naturalism" and his "skepticism". It should be much appreciated that Berry does explain what she means when talking about Nietzsche's "naturalism", abstaining from employing this term as a kind of label that announces an assertion's soundness without providing any argument. Firstly, "naturalistic" describes a "methodological program in which the standards of evidence and rules of inference used successfully in the natural sciences should serve as guidelines and models for reasoning in philosophy" (p. 69). Secondly, "naturalism" is the view that man, undoubtedly a part of nature, has no qualities pointing beyond and "above" nature but is "continuous with the rest of nature" (p. 75). It is perfectly understandable that Berry focuses her analysis on Human, All Too Human (HH), a work often regarded as a turning point in Nietzsche's career. It breaks with the project of an "artist's metaphysics" that shapes Nietzsche's early writings and, instead, presents sharp criticism of metaphysics along with lots of praise for the methods of natural science, of history and genealogy, as well as of psychology (see esp. HH I, Of First and Last Things). Nietzsche aims at overcoming metaphysical dualism, separating a realm of ideas, of concepts and values, of aeternae veritates from the transitory world of experience.

Berry takes Michel de Montaigne to be a crucial source of inspiration for Nietzsche's skeptical ventures at that time. Nietzsche's obvious esteem for Montaigne, "that such a man wrote has truly augmented the joy of living on this earth" (Schopenhauer as Educator 2), his intense occupation with the French moralists when he was working on Human, All Too Human (in Sorrento 1876-1877), together with the Pyrrhonian stature of Montaigne's intellectual attitude[4], make this decision an excellent choice. Berry selects the essay An Apology for Raymond Sebond for closer and exemplary exploration. She ascertains lines of naturalistic argumentation in Montaigne that are in accordance with Nietzsche's concerns: Human beings are not able to claim a special place in nature, elevating them over and above other creatures. Montaigne rejects, as Nietzsche does, man's vanity, arrogance, and false pride. Instead, he says, we should be "bringing Man into conformity with the majority of creatures. We are neither above nor below them" (Essais II: 12). This outlook corresponds with Nietzsche's visions. In Human, All Too Human he pictures a world in which

one would live among men and with oneself as in nature, without praise, reproaches, overzealousness, delighting in many things as in a spectacle that one formerly had only to fear. One would be free of this emphasis and would no longer feel the goading thought that one was not simply nature, or that one was more than nature (HH I: 34).

Montaigne and Nietzsche also agree on how to look at metaphysical inquiries, considering them to be theoretically and practically superfluous. A 'naturalistic' approach towards "first and last things" demands a methodology of inquiry that is in "continuity with the investigative techniques employed in the natural sciences" (p. 89, following Brian Leiter) -- whatever that means for specifically philosophical exploration.

Yet doesn't this 'positive' account of naturalism conflict with skepticism? Berry rejects this objection by asserting that Nietzschean "naturalism" is, in fact, "naturalistic skepticism" (pp. 91, 95) -- including a particular affinity to empiricism but excluding any dogmatic stance from this approach. Thus, anti-dogmatism is the most prominent feature of Nietzsche's "naturalistic skepticism", which aims, after all, at fostering man's "health" by fighting pathological claims on him, such as religious constraints and deceptive self-images that lead to self-betrayal.

For reasons of space, I can only give rather brief comments on Berry's discussion of three further key issues that play a central role in Nietzsche's philosophical thought. I'll begin with her consideration on "skepticism and health" (pp. 133-173), the topic that we have just started to analyze. While some negative prerequisites of "health" have already been mentioned, a positive account has to elucidate the bond between health and "cheerfulness" ("Fröhlichkeit"), a major theme of The Gay Science (Die fröhliche Wissenschaft). Nietzsche associates the kind of cheerfulness he has in mind with boldness, vigor, and strength. Since it results from an abundance of powers and energies, it can be connected to Nietzsche's idea of a "more dangerous and harder type of new skepticism … the skepticism of audacious manliness" that he unfolds in Beyond Good and Evil (209; cf. 208) and to which he gets back in The Anti-Christ (54). Explicitly, Nietzsche rejects any kind of calm joyfulness or any kind of mild skepticism (cf. BGE 208) that he considers weak and decadent, in sum: unhealthy. A decisive difficulty Berry has to face now is the question of how to relate this Nietzschean account to Pyrrhonian skepticism.

How to attain happiness is the main problem for all Hellenistic schools of thought; and under this label the issue of individual "health" or well-being was treated. While Pyrrhonian skeptics agreed with the other schools on understanding happiness in terms of ataraxia or tranquillity, they recommended a unique route leading towards this end. Like all the others, they say, they were in hopes of gaining tranquility by means of a decision regarding the disparity of the objects of sense and of thought. Being unable to effect this, however, they suspended judgment; and they found that tranquility, as if by chance, followed upon their suspension. (Outline I: 29)

But is it really tranquility that Nietzsche wants to promote? Certainly not. And for this reason, Berry consults Democritus, the "laughing philosopher", and refers to his treatise Peri Euthumiēs (On Cheerfulness) that is mentioned in Diogenes Laertius (IX: 46) and that appears to be closer to Nietzsche's approach (pp. 156-173). Yet can Democritus be included into the tradition of Pyrrhonian skepticism when there is only one, rather unspecified, supportive remark in Diogenes Laertuis' account on Pyrrho (IX: 72), and clearly negative statements in regard to this question can be found in Sextus Empiricus (one of which, cf. Outline I: 213, Berry does not quote properly on p. 168)? Additionally, there is another difficulty: Does Democritus' conception of euthumia really match Nietzsche's idea of cheerfulness (have a look at what Stobaeus reports; one fragment is quoted in Berry, pp. 159-160)? Nietzsche would respond to Democritus' kind of therapeutic approach that focuses on what is possible by quoting from Goethe's Faust: "Den lieb' ich, der Unmögliches begehrt."

Berry's discussion of "perspectivism and ephexis in interpretation" (pp. 104-132) takes up the problem of truth again, concentrating on Nietzsche's mature conception. Here Nietzsche turns the doctrine of perspectivism against an ideal of "objectivity" that absurdly promises to subtract any subjective contribution from cognition. Thus, Nietzsche exposes and emphasizes the fact that anyone in quest of cognition has to take a standpoint. There is no view from nowhere, as there is no view from everywhere. However, there are more or less honest ways of employing perspectives and taking standpoints. Berry does a great deal to support one line of argumentation that Nietzsche offers concerning this question. As a trained philologist, he praises the advantages of philology. Philology "should be understood … as the art of reading well, -- to be able to read facts without falsifying them through interpretation, without letting the desire to understand make you lose caution, patience, subtlety. Philology as ephexis in interpretation" (Anti-Christ 52). Nietzsche pleads, in other words, for skeptical forms of interpretation; and each act of cognition necessarily implies interpretation of given data from some standpoint. This, however, is only one line of reasoning on interpretation that we find in Nietzsche. Another one, linked to his doctrine of the will to power, obviously favors a less restrained, in fact, very straightforward and even violent employment of interpretation (see Genealogy of Morality II: 12, III: 24). The problem of how to reconcile Nietzsche's skepticism with his theory of power arises (see Berry's remarks pp. 127-130), a problem certainly deserving further investigation.

The book's last chapter is dedicated to the relation between "skepticism and immoralism" (pp. 174-214). The most interesting point is that Nietzsche's ethical skepticism should not be confused with theories of moral antirealism. What Nietzsche, skeptically, rather wants to achieve is to challenge our quasi-natural faith in morality -- for reasons of intellectual integrity. This skeptical, reserved attitude that does not rule out the option of adopting moral convention is nicely disclosed in Nietzsche's late statement: "I do not refute ideals, I just put on gloves when I have to deal with them" (Ecce Homo, Preface 3; quoted on p. 201).

Nietzsche and the Ancient Skeptical Tradition is rich in content, carefully argued, and always inspiring. Even though Berry's interpretation looks somewhat forced at times, it presents an important new perspective on Nietzsche -- given his aversion towards any self-contained edifice of thought.

[1] See Sören Reuter, An der "Begräbnisstätte der Anschauung". Nietzsches Bild- und Wahrnehmungstheorie in Ueber Wahrheit und Lüge im aussermoralischen Sinne. Basel: Schwabe Verlag, 2009.

[2] See Anthonie Meijers and Martin Stingelin, "Konkordanz Nietzsche-Gerber", Nietzsche-Studien 17 (1988), pp. 350-368.

[3] Ibid., p. 367.

[4] It is known that Montaigne had a medal struck that showed a pair of scales in perfect balance and carried the inscription: EPECHO, Pyrrho's maxim.