Nietzsche and The Birth of Tragedy

Placeholder book cover

Paul Raimond Daniels, Nietzsche and The Birth of Tragedy, Acumen, 2013, 240pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844652433.

Reviewed by Matthew Meyer, The University of Scranton


And herewith I again touch that point from which I once went forth: The Birth of Tragedy was my first revaluation of all values. Herewith I again stand on the soil out of which my intention, my ability grows -- I, the last disciple of the philosopher Dionysus -- I, the teacher of the eternal recurrence (TI "What I Owe" 5).[1]

This claim, found at the end of the 1888 Twilight of the Idols, points the reader of Nietzsche's much-studied late works back to his first book-length publication from 1872, The Birth of Tragedy (BT). That the work of a young philologist should contain the seeds for Nietzsche's later revaluation of values and his teaching of the eternal recurrence will seem puzzling, if not absurd, to many. However, before such a judgment can be fairly rendered, one needs to have a good sense of what BT is about, and this poses some difficulty for many readers because the work requires a familiarity not only with philosophers such as Socrates, Plato, Kant, and Schopenhauer, but also the various genres of ancient Greek poetry and how they might relate to developments in modern opera. It is for these reasons that those interested in Nietzsche's later writings should always welcome informed, accurate, and accessible commentaries on BT, and although not flawless, Paul Raimond Daniels' Nietzsche and The Birth of Tragedy constitutes such a contribution to the standing literature on Nietzsche's first work.

Daniels' book is divided into six chapters and includes both a detailed chronology of Nietzsche's life and a guide for further reading. The first chapter elucidates the influences that inform BT, and the final chapter treats the relationship between BT and Nietzsche's later writings. The intervening four chapters are sensibly divided and largely remain faithful to the structure of Nietzsche's text. Although Douglas Burnham and Martin Jesinghausen have recently argued that BT is divided into two parts, with the fault line occurring after section twelve,[2] Daniels rightly follows the more standard view that the work has a tripartite structure and is thus divided into Nietzsche's accounts of the birth (sections 1-10), death (sections 11-15), and rebirth of tragedy (sections 16-25). The only discrepancy between Daniels' work and the structure of Nietzsche's text is that Daniels devotes two chapters to discussing Nietzsche's account of the birth of tragedy. Whereas Daniels' second chapter treats the Apollonian-Dionysian dialectic in sections 1-6, chapter three deals with tragedy proper in sections 7-10. The fourth and fifth chapters are then devoted to themes relating to the death and rebirth of tragedy, respectively.

The book starts strong. The first chapter includes a useful summary of Schopenhauer's philosophy (11-22) and some helpful remarks about the influences of Friedrich Ritschl, Jacob Burckhardt, and Richard Wagner on the young Nietzsche (22-35). Chapter two introduces both Apollo and Dionysus and explains how both Homeric epic and lyric poetry respond to the pessimistic wisdom of Silenus. Chapter three develops some interesting reflections on Prometheus Unbound (88-94) and concludes with an extensive discussion of the "Schopenhauerian question" as to whether BT can indeed be read as a life-affirming book (94-105). Chapter four situates Nietzsche's account of the death of tragedy at the hands of Euripides and Socrates within the broader context of what Plato called the ancient quarrel between philosophy and poetry (107), and the chapter contains an extended analysis of Socrates' role as both "villain" and "saviour" in Nietzsche's text (131).

The unity and coherence of the work does, however, decline in the concluding chapters. Although chapter five presents a helpful discussion of the music-making Socrates (141-147) and chapter six explores the relationship between philosophy and art in Nietzsche's later works (180-187), both chapters tend to stray from their subject matter. In his account of Nietzsche's hopes for a rebirth of tragedy in chapter five, Daniels includes a detour through Nietzsche's 1873 essay "On Truth and Lies in a Non-Moral Sense" (157-160). Similarly, the penultimate section of chapter six, which is about the relationship of BT to Nietzsche's later writings, contains an extended excursus on Nietzsche and Rilke (187-200).

Although there is much to recommend in Daniels' text, I want to focus on some areas where I think his account could be improved. One minor concern is that Daniels groups together Nietzsche's discussion of lyric poetry in sections five and six with Nietzsche's discussion of Homer's epic poetry in sections three and four under the rubric of the Apollonian-Dionysian dialectic. This is a concern because so many readers fail to distinguish between the Apollonian-Dionysian dialectic in Nietzsche's treatment of Homeric poetry and the Apollonian-Dionysian dialectic in Nietzsche's treatment of the lyric poetry that flowers into tragedy. In sections three and four, Nietzsche's point is that even an Apollonian art, like Homeric epic, is related to the Dionysian because it responds to the Dionysian wisdom of Silenus, one which states that non-existence is preferable to existence because life is constituted by senseless suffering. On this model, Apollonian illusions shield us from the ugly, Dionysian truth. Although Nietzsche does believe that all Greek art functions as a response to Dionysian or Silenic wisdom, this does not capture the full scope of the way in which tragedy, as a combination of Apollonian and Dionysian art, can affirm life even in the face of Dionysian wisdom.

My concern is that although Daniels notes differences between the Apollonian-Dionysian dialectic as applied to epic poetry and the Apollonian-Dionysian dialectic as applied to lyric and tragic poetry (85, 98), he nevertheless sees the Dionysian as a will-negating truth (86) akin to a "lethal poison" (99) that needs "the seductive, soothing language of Apolline art" merely to be endured (4). What is missing in Daniels' account is the fact that Nietzsche assigns to the Dionysian arts of music and dance the capacity to affirm the suffering and death that characterize human existence. In other words, Dionysian art itself is capable of transfiguring the terrible truth of Dionysian wisdom.

That Daniels overlooks this aspect of Nietzsche's project is evidenced by the absence of any substantive discussion of musical dissonance.[3] Although he briefly broaches the topic in his account of Wagner's influence on Nietzsche (33), Daniels later argues that, "the purpose for Dionysiac music is to be able to sustain the believability of a new mythos given the renewed tragic wisdom of Schopenhauer" (151). While not incorrect, such a limited understanding of Dionysian music renders it subservient to Apollonian myth and overlooks the independent role it plays in the aesthetic justification of existence. In his final discussion of this central motif of BT,[4] Nietzsche explains the way in which musical dissonance, like the tragic myth, can transform the ugly and disharmonic elements of existence into an artistic game (BT 24). In contrast to the Apollonian myth that veils the truth through beautiful appearances, Dionysian music allows us to affirm pleasure and pain, the beautiful and the ugly, and ultimately the entire cycle of creation and destruction. Thus, Nietzsche argues that music enables us to experience joy even in the destruction of the Apollonian hero (BT 16) and so move beyond the pity and fear that Aristotle thought was the proper response to the tragic performance (BT 22).

Daniels' relative neglect of musical dissonance also limits his ability to defend what he calls his "affirmative reading" against the "Schopenhauer reading" of BT. The latter interpretation, articulated most notably by Julian Young, argues that the Apollonian solution to the problem of suffering is superficial and relies on self-deception, and so even though Apollonian art might enable us to deceive ourselves into thinking that life is worth living, it actually is not (96). Thus, Young argues that BT is actually a life-denying, pessimistic work.

Daniels rightly rejects Young's reading, first, by arguing that the Apollonian element in tragedy is not a mere veiling of the Dionysian, but rather a life-affirming representation of the Dionysian itself. Second, Daniels responds to Young by introducing an important distinction between descriptive pessimism, which merely describes the suffering that characterizes existence, and prescriptive pessimism, which prescribes that we ought to deny life given the truth of descriptive pessimism (98). On the one hand, this distinction allows Daniels to explain the way in which Nietzsche is, like Schopenhauer and Silenus, a pessimist in the descriptive sense but not, in contrast to Schopenhauer and Silenus, a pessimist in the prescriptive sense. On the other hand, Daniels argues that the Greeks did not, as Young claims, "deceive or delude themselves" (103) about the value of life because they were able to conflate the "is" of description and the "ought" of prescription into a unity (102).

Although Daniels is certainly right to argue that the Greeks did not affirm life through self-deception, it seems wrong to think that the Greeks did this by conflating the "is" and the "ought" into an aesthetic unity. This is because the is-ought distinction is neither Greek nor, as Daniels claims, Schopenhauerian (172). Instead, it is something that we scholars use to explain how Nietzsche's aesthetic Greeks both embrace and reject aspects of Silenic wisdom and how Nietzsche both follows and breaks with Schopenhauer. Moreover, this split cannot be Schopenhauerian because implicit in the argument of BT is Nietzsche's view that Schopenhauer mistakenly believes that prescriptive pessimism necessarily follows from descriptive pessimism. In contrast, Nietzsche argues that no evaluative or prescriptive judgment follows from the fact that suffering is an ineluctable feature of existence, and musical dissonance is such an important phenomenon for Nietzsche because it, like tragedy itself, reveals the way in which human beings can experience suffering as a stimulant to life.

Nevertheless, the distinction Daniels makes between descriptive and prescriptive pessimism is important because it helps explain how Socratic philosophy destroyed tragedy in ancient Greece and how Kant and Schopenhauer have contributed to the rebirth of tragedy in the modern world. According to Daniels, Socrates destroyed tragedy by supplanting the descriptive pessimism of Silenus with an optimistic program that attributes to reason the power to cure the suffering that is, on the pessimistic model, ineluctable (5, 132). As Daniels also explains, Nietzsche thinks that Socratic optimism begins to erode with Kant's epistemology and then suffers its collapse with Schopenhauer's pessimism (5). However, Nietzsche argues that if philosophically inclined individuals now confronted with the truth of descriptive pessimism can learn to play music (or just appreciate Wagner's), the prescriptive pessimism of Schopenhauer can be reversed (147).

Although he gets the general trajectory of Nietzsche's account of the collapse of Socratism right, Daniels fails to make an important distinction between Socrates' quest for truth through philosophy and science and a Socratic optimism that attaches human happiness to this quest. Most notably, Daniels quotes the same passage to define both Socratism and science as the notion "that the depths of nature can be fathomed and that knowledge can heal all ills" (5, 132) (BT 19). Not only is this a bizarre definition of science, it is wrong to think that science and Socratism are synonymous (5). This is because although the scientific quest for truth is part of Socratism, Socratism also includes the optimistic belief that science can cure human suffering, which is what the previous quote articulates.

Recognizing that Socratism has two distinct components, namely, optimism and the quest for truth via philosophy and science, is key for understanding how Socratism self-destructs. Specifically, it is philosophy and science that eventually show optimism for what Nietzsche thinks it is, namely, a groundless myth. If this is right, Daniels must be mistaken in holding, first, that science "reaches its own fallacy and turns into a pure, pessimistic negation of existence" (5) and, second, that science "has implicit aesthetic grounds" (108). It is not science that reaches its own fallacy, but rather it is science that reveals the fallacy of optimism, and it is not science that depends on aesthetic illusion, but rather a Socratic optimism that science shows to have no basis in reality.

In the final chapter, Daniels assesses BT in relation to Nietzsche's later writings. Not only does he rightly argue that the anti-moral thrust of Nietzsche's first work contains the seeds for his later critique of Christianity (178), Daniels also claims that BT merely outlines, in conceptual form, an aesthetic justification of existence as "a bare possibility" (182). Because it does not execute such a justification, the text points beyond itself to Dionysian art, and although the Dionysian art that the young Nietzsche has in mind is clearly that of Wagnerian opera, Daniels argues that BT is later "redeemed with Nietzsche's own poetry," which, for Daniels, is Nietzsche's Dionysian-Dithyrambs (200). Here, Daniels' view can be further supported by the fact that scholars have argued that Zarathustra is Nietzsche's own tragedy,[5] and so it can be construed as the work in which Nietzsche's concept of the Dionysian becomes a supreme deed (EH "Zarathustra" 6).[6]For these and other reasons, Daniels is certainly right to conclude his work by claiming that BT "is central to understanding Nietzsche's later philosophy" and that the questions of his first text "recurred to Nietzsche throughout his life with renewed importance" (208).

Although I have quibbled with some of the details of his account and noted some of the ways in which his text could be improved, Daniels provides an accessible and reliable commentary that gets the general trajectory of BT right and raises a number of important questions regarding the relationship of the text to Nietzsche's later philosophy. It is for these reasons that Nietzsche and The Birth of Tragedy complements and improves upon the existing literature on Nietzsche's first work and thus can be recommended to readers of Nietzsche encountering BT for the first time.

[1] Friedrich Nietzsche, Twilight of the Idols, in The Portable Nietzsche, ed. W. Kaufmann, 463-563. New York: Viking Press, 1954. Cited by abbreviated chapter title and section number.

[2] Douglas Burnham and Martin Jesinghausen, Nietzsche's The Birth of Tragedy: A Reader's Guide. London: Continuum, 2010.

[3] On this point, Burnham and Jesinghausen's work (2010) is to be preferred, as they provide an extended discussion of musical dissonance in their commentary on the penultimate section of Nietzsche's text.

[4] Friedrich Nietzsche, The Birth of Tragedy and Other Writings, trans. R. Speirs. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999. Cited by section number.

[5] Paul S. Loeb, The Death of Nietzsche's Zarathustra. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.

[6] Friedrich Nietzsche, Ecce Homo, trans. W. Kaufmann. New York: Vintage Books, 1989. Cited by abbreviated chapter title and section number.