Nietzsche, Biology and Metaphor

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Moore, Gregory, Nietzsche, Biology and Metaphor, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 228pp, $55.00, ISBN 0-521-81230-5.

Reviewed by Iain Morrison, University of Texas at Austin


Moore’s intention in this deeply historical book is to situate Nietzsche’s thoughts in the context of two dominant trends in late-nineteenth century European intellectual life – evolutionary biology and fin-de-siècle theories of degeneration. According to Moore, Nietzsche was well read in the literature of both areas, and consequently, his philosophy is heavily influenced by the emerging debates about the evolution and/or degeneration of man. In this respect – and this is one of Moore’s key claims – Nietzsche did not transcend his time to the extent that he repeatedly claims. For Moore, a measure of the contemporary influence on Nietzsche is found in his use of biological/medical language, and a central objective of this book is to decipher this language – to discriminate Nietzsche’s literal from his metaphorical uses. Moore promises to analyze Nietzsche’s use of concepts such as evolution, degeneration, health, sickness, etc., and to tell us how much Nietzsche borrowed from the dominant paradigm of his time and how much, through metaphor and ironic distance, he transcended the contemporary discussion.

Broadly speaking, Moore presents two central arguments: first, he contends that Nietzsche developed his own theory of evolution which was, like so many other nineteenth-century evolutionary theories, anti-Darwinian. Moore studies the impact of Nietzsche’s evolutionary theory on his accounts of morality and art and in doing so sets up a distinction between his own interpretation and “a long tradition of Nietzsche scholarship which has viewed his characteristic appeal to the language and concepts of biology as mere rhetorical posturing, as an ironic counterweight to the otherworldliness of traditional” views (p. 85). Second, Moore concludes that Nietzsche goes beyond his age primarily by turning Christian concerns with degeneracy, decadence and mental illness back upon Christianity itself. For Moore, this ironic move is Nietzsche’s most distinguishing philosophical trait. Moore also traces Nietzsche’s medical talk of decadence through his analyses of art and morality. (These two lines of thought correspond to the two parts of the book.)

Nietzsche, Biology and Metaphor is a fascinating reconstruction of pockets of nineteenth century intellectual history and contains some intriguing accounts of the influence on Nietzsche’s thinking of biologists such as Wilhelm Roux and William Rolph. Moore traces Nietzsche’s view of agency as a war between conflicting internal forces to the work of Roux who argued that “organs, tissues, cells and even molecules of organic matter are found in an unceasing struggle for existence with one another for food, space and the utilization of external stimulation” (p. 37). Roux was aware that this account of the internal workings of an organism begged the question as to why such an organism did not simply fall apart under the stress of this ongoing competition. He accounted for prolonged existence in terms of the notion of self-regulation – which essentially means that the organism temporarily stabilizes when its most adapted components prevail. According to Moore, Nietzsche borrowed Roux’s theory in developing his notion of agency as a conflict of multiple internal forces periodically resolving itself through the establishment of a regulative hierarchy.

Another major influence on Nietzsche was William Rolph who argued against what he perceived as Darwin’s insistence on the primacy of a survival instinct. For Rolph, the primary biological urge was for expansion and not preservation. In commenting on Rolph, Moore writes:

For Rolph denies the existence of an instinct for self-preservation – or at the very least rejects the notion that such a drive represents the principal motivation of animal behavior. Rather, life seeks primarily to expand itself. This elementary proposition is expressed as a law of assimilation, a law operative in both the organic and inorganic world. Growth, Rolph argues, is determined by a process of diffusion, in which endosmosis predominates over exosmosis. (p. 47)

Much of Moore’s book contains similarly detailed accounts of obscure, but as far as Nietzsche is concerned extremely relevant, biological theories. Thus, some of Nietzsche’s central notions – for example, the fractured agent and the will to power – are cast against a backdrop of contemporary biology, filled as it was with a proliferation of misreadings and misguided criticisms of Darwin. Moore’s treatment of the effects of these biologists on Nietzsche’s thinking is thoroughly convincing and gives real content to the widely accepted, though vague, idea that Nietzsche was “influenced” by contemporary science.

My high regard for Moore’s study is, however, tempered by two serious concerns. The first is Moore’s almost exclusive reliance on Nietzsche’s unpublished notes. At this stage in Nietzsche scholarship, the debate over the use of his notes is all too familiar, and I will not rehearse it here. In recreating Nietzsche’s reading and understanding of contemporary biologists Moore relies on the notes to such an extent that the reader begins to get the impression that he is unearthing a hidden Nietzsche. Unfortunately, he never brings this underground Nietzsche to the surface. Nietzsche’s published works are not just influenced by contemporary biology but also by Greek philosophy, by Kant and Schopenhauer, by Christian writers, etc. Moore never fully acknowledges this, and for the most part, treats the biological Nietzsche as the only Nietzsche. Thus, certain problems arise with Moore’s interpretation of Nietzsche on morality and art because he does not juxtapose the theories that he culls from the notes and the published views. I will mention three such problems.

In tracing the impact of Nietzsche’s biologism through his critique of morality Moore says: “It is against this historical backdrop, I believe, that we must reconsider Nietzsche’s naturalistic critique of traditional morality” (p. 58). This backdrop is, in part, made up of Nietzsche’s theory of evolution, according to which the driving force in evolution is not natural selection or the struggle for existence, but the will to power. Moore tells us that Nietzsche differentiates the evolution of the strong and the weak. The evolution of the strong is a matter of the springing forth of isolated cases of intense complexity and individuality. Evolution then is the “sudden eruption of life’s creative energies” (p. 54). The weak evolve by gathering in increasingly large groups and reaching higher and higher levels of adaptation. One of their adaptive strategies is morality. Thus, the morality of the majority is herd morality, which is a pattern of habitual and heritable behavior promoting the continued survival of the social organism. According to Moore, Nietzsche’s self-governing individual “emerges from the social organism” when “with the natural cycle of growth and decay, the social organism begins gradually to disintegrate” (p. 82). Moore writes:

Once the self-regulative capacity which prevented the internal collapse of a mesh of antagonistic constituent parts is destroyed – that is, in periods of moral degeneration and corruption – then ‘the liberated egos struggle for mastery’ (VII 1,1[20]). This struggle characterizes not only a process of emancipation, but of progressive individuation. (p. 82)

This social collapse leaves the herd members without internal regulation and in the ensuing conditions only those strong individuals capable of self-regulation will flourish.

According to Moore, this account is supposed to “clearly anticipate” Nietzsche’s “more famous differentiation of master and slave moralities in Beyond Good and Evil and On the Genealogy of Morality” (p. 62). But does it? Moore writes that for Nietzsche the higher individualistic morality emerges from the lower herd morality. Man’s original state is one of a herd-like mentality from which a higher individuality emerges. But Nietzsche is adamant in the Genealogy that the higher (master) morality comes first and that lower (slave) morality is a reaction. If anything, what Moore has pointed to may form the basis for Nietzsche’s understanding of the morality of mores. Nietzsche explicitly links herd instinct and morality of mores in The Gay Science 149 and 296. But Moore never introduces Nietzsche’s published discussion of master morality, slave morality or the morality of mores in order to even point to differences or gaps between the published and unpublished accounts, or to explain how exactly the unpublished theory that he outlines is supposed to “anticipate” Nietzsche’s better-known account.

Moore’s account of the development of Nietzsche’s critique of morality also suffers from his almost exclusive focus on the notes. In assessing Human, All Too Human Moore claims that unlike Nietzsche’s later thinking “there is no attempt… to view moral imperatives as merely the rationalization of feelings accompanying certain physiological states” (p. 59). If this is to suggest a shift in Nietzsche’s published works toward a different kind of analysis after Human, All Too Human, then it is straightforwardly inaccurate. In Human, All Too Human 44 Nietzsche analyzes the moral weight of gratitude as a rationalization of a desire for revenge. In Human, All Too Human 45, Nietzsche tells us that good and bad have a dual history and that “whoever has the power to repay good with good, evil with evil is called good.” Feelings of power and strength are associated with being a member of a tightly knit “caste.” Though powerlessness is not first and foremost a physiological state, these sections demonstrate that Moore is trying to point to a development that does not exist in the published works. Quite simply, Nietzsche retains the same kind of analysis from Human, All Too Human to the Genealogy – grounding morality in a combination of social structures and individual psychology.

Finally, Moore characterizes Nietzsche’s early criticisms of morality as a critique of the teleological assumptions in contemporary moral theories. Thus, Nietzsche criticizes Spencer’s view that morality serves both self-preservation and preservation of the community. Moore adds that this analysis takes place before Nietzsche develops the theory of will to power and bemoans the development of this later theory claiming that it opens Nietzsche himself up to a critique of teleological explanations. He writes: “his early evolutionism is far more ‘Darwinian’ – and certainly less teleological – than his later theory of the will to power” (p. 66). But how can this interpretation be reconciled with Beyond Good and Evil 13 where Nietzsche writes:

Physiologists should think again before postulating the drive to self-preservation as the cardinal drive in an organic being. A living thing desires above all to vent its strength – life as such is will to power -: self-preservation is only one of the indirect and most frequent consequences of it. – In short, here as everywhere, beware of superfluous teleological principles!

Clearly, Nietzsche’s own understanding of will to power as non-teleological is at odds with the account that Moore compiles from the notes.

In the end what Moore establishes is that Nietzsche’s thinking in his notes does not transcend his time. Given that these are “unpublished notes” often compiled during the reading of other works it is perhaps unsurprising that they contain many virtual paraphrases of things read. Nietzsche’s published works, on the other hand, typically reflect all the various influences and interests that affected him in his writing, and Moore’s focus on the notes simply disqualifies him from being able to make a judgment on the extent to which these published works do or do not take Nietzsche beyond the contemporary scene.

My second main criticism of the book is that it lacks a certain interpretive rigor. To take just one example: in Chapter 4 Moore initially argues that Nietzsche, perhaps influenced by Comte Arthur de Gobineau, traces contemporary decadence to the racial intermingling of the nineteenth century (p. 123). But, later in the same section, Moore argues that Nietzsche, under the influence of Charles Féré, equates degeneracy and weakness of the will. We might expect that Moore would then go on to give a causal account of weakness of will in terms of racial intermingling, but in actual fact he argues that Nietzsche, following Féré, posits a number of other factors leading to weakness of will including overwork, malnutrition, rapid industrialization (p. 127). Racial intermingling simply drops out of the account. This is not an insurmountable problem, or even an unusual occurrence in reading Nietzsche, since he often gives many accounts of the same phenomenon. But the Nietzsche commentator must take on the challenge of reconciling the various accounts or at least placing them in a time-line. In general, Moore does not engage in this kind of analysis to a sufficient degree.

Having made these criticisms I must, at the same time, say that the primary virtue of this book is that it shows us a different Nietzsche: it enriches our understanding of Nietzsche as a nineteenth century figure. Most readers of Nietzsche could say one or two things about the influence of contemporary science but this book introduces many of the specifics in a very scholarly way. (For example, Moore is excellent in detailing Nietzsche’s disgust at the extent to which contemporary science was co-opted by Christian values and turned to traditional ends.) What remains to be done is to bring Moore’s interpretation of Nietzsche together with the best current readings of Nietzsche’s published work. I am confident that such an exercise would throw light on many interpretive disputes in Nietzsche scholarship – such as the disagreement over the status of the will to power doctrine – and thereby enrich our understanding of one of Europe’s greatest thinkers.