Nietzsche, Naturalism and Normativity

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Christopher Janaway and Simon Robertson (eds.), Nietzsche, Naturalism and Normativity, Oxford University Press, 2012, 262pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199583676.

Reviewed by Brian Leiter, University of Chicago


This volume comprises nine new essays, primarily on various topics in Nietzsche's ethics, especially his critique of morality, meta-ethics and moral psychology; only one essay primarily concerns the meaning of "naturalism." The contributors include, besides the editors, several well-known figures in Anglophone Nietzsche studies: R. Lanier Anderson, Nadeem Hussain, Peter Poellner, Bernard Reginster, and Richard Schacht. Of perhaps special interest is that the volume features two essays by well-known moral philosophers, Peter Railton and Alan Thomas, neither of whom has written on Nietzsche previously. Almost all the essays (with an exception to be noted) are written to a high standard of scholarly care and philosophical argumentation, and can be read profitably by philosophers not primarily interested in Nietzsche. The volume as a whole is essential for Nietzsche scholars, and some of the essays will interest moral philosophers more generally.

The essays can be grouped into three main areas. First, when Nietzsche critiques morality, what is his target and how can his critique (and his naturalism) be squared with his own evaluative views (Railton, Simon Robertson)? Call this, following my terminology (Leiter 2002: 74-77, which Robertson explicitly adopts), "the Scope Problem." Second, several essays (Hussain, Poellner, Thomas) address metaethical questions, in particular, what the metaphysical and semantic status and character of Nietzsche's own evaluative judgments are supposed to be. Third, three other authors (Anderson, Christopher Janaway, Reginster) examine aspects of Nietzsche's moral psychology, particularly his conception of human agency, motivation, and the self. Finally, Schacht is the only author to focus exclusively on the question of what Nietzsche's naturalism amounts to; unfortunately, his is the weakest essay in the volume. I will return to it briefly at the end in order to focus first on the more philosophically serious pieces.

Let us begin with the "Scope Problem." Robertson's meticulous paper takes up the challenge of how "to separate the object of [Nietzsche's] critique [of morality] from [Nietzsche's] positive ideal," and in such a way that the positive ideal is not vulnerable to the same objections Nietzsche lodges against morality (p. 81). Robertson fairly canvasses various accounts in the literature -- by Maudemarie Clark, Philippa Foot, myself, and Bernard Williams -- but then focuses on my account (Leiter 2002: 78 ff.), which he basically accepts, while proposing one interesting emendation. I had proposed that Nietzsche's targets in critiquing morality ("morality in the pejorative sense" or MPS) were systems of value that (1) presupposed particular descriptive claims about human agency and/or (2) embodied normative commitments harmful to those Nietzsche views as higher human beings. Robertson challenges my account of the descriptive component, arguing that any account of (1) would be more "theoretically . . . satisfying" if it explains why MPS harms higher human beings, per the complaint in (2) (p. 91). Robertson's interesting idea is that, in addition to contesting presuppositions about agency, Nietzsche also

conceives of morality as embodying a commitment to objectivity, such that . . . there are objective moral facts, truths and values . . . [and] morality is normatively authoritative in that compliance with it is categorically required . . . and morality is universal in jurisdiction. (p. 92).

I had tried to capture the last part with the idea that part of the descriptive component of MPS was the (false) idea that agents are sufficiently similar in terms of their interests that "one moral code is appropriate for all" (Leiter 2002: 80). Robertson argues that morality's claim to be "normatively authoritative" (roughly, one's moral obligations do not depends on one's antecedent motivations,[93]) makes better sense of what we both agree on -- that Nietzsche thinks MPS claims "universal" applicability -- than my alternative (98-99). In particular, he claims that my view that MPS treats all agents as sufficiently similar that one morality is appropriate for all of them is just "surplus to the explanation of how morality's claim to universality" (99) affects everyone, even those harmed by it. On Robertson's account, then, one of the crucial presuppositions of MPS is that it claims a universal jurisdiction, but not as a matter of descriptive claims about human agency, but as a kind of brute "metaphysics" of morality. One interpretive question that will now arise is on what basis Nietzsche rejects it. Robertson goes on to explore how this revision of my account also allows us to appreciate points developed by Clark and Williams and come to a more satisfactory answer to the Scope Problem.

Railton is interested in the "scope problem," but also in the challenge that Nietzsche's naturalism poses for the idea of normativity. He is pleasingly clear about the latter:

Where in the portrait of the natural world and its laws, and of the human organism and its physio-chemical nature, does one find anything corresponding to free will as we understand it? Or to autonomy -- the capacity to be governed by reason according to principles we impose upon ourselves, not merely dominated by causal laws and lacking ultimate responsibility for our actions? . . . doesn't such thorough-going naturalism also threaten Nietzsche's positive view? For isn't he making recommendations of his own, pointing to reasons to reject the "strange simplification and falsification man lives" in acting "for the good" or "for God" [citing Beyond Good and Evil, 24]? . . . What then becomes of the possibility of normative action-guidance -- of acting for a reason rather than simply as a result of causal forces? (22-23)

Railton does not explicitly consider the possibility that this kind of normativity and "acting for a reason" disappears, even if we continue to "talk the talk" of reasons for action. He, instead, crafts a richly evocative account of how a serious naturalist who rejects free will and autonomy could nonetheless aspire to normativity, to providing "reasons" for action.

With respect to the "scope problem," Railton proposes a fruitful distinction between "normative concepts proper" which are basically "directive" (concepts such as "rule, norm, standard, law, right, wrong, correct, incorrect") and "evaluative concepts" (like "good, bad, noble, base, fine, magnificent . . . detestable, lovable, hateful, beautiful, ugly, sublime, disgusting, amusing"), which are not (25). He then distinguishes four dimensions along which these two kinds of concepts differ: fit, voluntariness, continuity, and exclusiveness (26). Briefly: (1) with regard to "fit," normative concepts either require or exclude certain conduct, while evaluative concepts emphasize "realizing or harmonizing with a 'nature,' telos, end or purposes" (26); (2) with regard to voluntariness, normative concepts suppose that "ought implies can," while evaluative concepts mainly apply to "non-voluntary states, attitudes or motivations as well as acts" (26); (3) with regard to continuity, normative concepts (unsurprisingly, given the fit requirement) are "typically binary . . . as conditions that must be met," that is, they either are satisfied or not, while normative concepts "can be realized to greater or lesser degrees" (26); finally (4) normative concepts can not abide "practical contradictions" (either you must do it or not!), while conflicting evaluative concepts "can coexist and be promoted in a single act, event, object, or individual" (26).

Railton assumes that Nietzsche's attack on freedom and autonomy undermines the sense of the normative concepts, but not the evaluative concepts, which seems right to me. (Railton also allows, crucially, in a footnote [p. 26 n. 7] that normative concepts are acceptable if "embedded" in the evaluative concepts.) Railton's strategy then is to introduce increasingly complex portraits of individuals whose actions satisfy the evaluative concepts (e.g., a skilled mariner navigating a storm [31] and an aesthete experiencing a painting at a museum [35]), portraits which we are to imagine viewing "from the inside," as it were, so that we come to appreciate the skills made manifest, and thus can see how "normative force operates less by argument or reasoning than by inspiring admiration and appreciation" (46). If that is all that "reasons for action" amounts to, then the account does seem compatible with Nietzsche's, since "reasons for action" in this context appears to mean nothing more than "causes inspiration and emulation."

Two of the three essays on broadly meta-ethical themes are concerned primarily with issues about the semantics of moral judgment. Hussain argues, convincingly to my mind, against the anachronistic reading of Nietzsche as a "non-cognitivist" in Clark and  Dudrick (2007). Thomas, conversely, argues against Hussain's "fictionalist" reading as adequate to explain Nietzsche's revaluation of values, and suggests, instead, that we would do well (with a nod to Langsam [1997]) to explore the idea that Nietzsche is a kind of subjective realist about value, though one who makes room for "a reflective acknowledgement of the role of the subject in placing conditions on value" (154). Anyone working on the most plausible semantics of moral judgment to ascribe to Nietzsche will benefit from these two sophisticated engagements with the issues.

Since I am skeptical -- partly for reasons Hussain and Thomas, perhaps unintentionally, illustrate with their careful attention to what Nietzsche says -- that Nietzsche's texts settle any interesting question about the semantics of normative judgment (Leiter 2000; Hussain appears now to agree: cf. his 2013: 412), I will focus instead on Poellner's essay, "Aestheticist Ethics," which presents a rich and challenging view of the metaphysics of value according to Nietzsche. Poellner uses two passages from Nietzsche to illustrate what he calls Nietzsche's "aestheticist style of evaluation" (57). One (58) is Nietzsche's appraisal of Wagner's Meistersinger, which I quote in part:

Now it seems archaic, now strange, acid and too young, it is as arbitrary as it is pompous-traditional, it is not infrequently puckish, still more often rough and uncouth -- it has fire and spirit and at the same time the loose yellow skin of fruits which ripen too late. It flows broad and full: and suddenly a moment of inexplicable hesitation . . . an oppression producing dreams, almost a nightmare -- but already the old stream of well-being, of happiness old and new, very much including the well-being of the artist himself. (Beyond Good and Evil, sec. 240)

On Poellner's rendering, Nietzsche's evaluation of the music "concern[s] mostly its expressive properties" (60), that is, properties that express actual or possible mental states. Nietzsche's response to the music, Poellner says, is "more adequately characterized as a direct (non-inferential) experience, a perception, of certain sensory phenomena as suitable or appropiate for the expression of certain mental states" (59). Notice that the claim that the experience is one of certain phenomena "as suitable or appropriate" for expressing mental states is added by Poellner; nothing in the passage, as far as I can see, requires it. Undoubtedly, Nietzsche describes his experience of the music as expressing these properties: but where is the experience of suitability or appropriateness? It cannot simply be that Nietzsche so describes the music, since that is equally compatible with denying the claim about suitability.

Poellner wants to import a kind of aesthetic realism (of a surprisingly Kantian kind) into his reading of Nietzsche. He says, plausibly (and consistent with Nietzsche's view, I believe), that in an aesthetic experience the "awareness of certain phenomenal features of the object . . . includes or motivates an affective response to the object" (61). To this, Poellner adds, without additional textual evidence, that "an aesthetic experience presents its object as having an autonomous value" (61). "Autonomous" is, however, ambiguous, and Poellner's gloss on it may not be inconsistent with Nietzsche's writing: "The affective component of the experience is motivated by what the phenomenal object itself is, not by what it may be instrumentally good for" (61). None of this yet gets us the surprising idea that the aesthetic experience of the object represents it as "suitable" or "appropriate" for expressing the mental states it expresses. Bear in mind that Nietzsche clearly views aesthetic experience and pleasure as on a continuum with sexual experience and pleasure (see, e.g., the Third Essay of the Genealogy, sections 6 and 9, but also section 4 of the "What I Owe to the Ancients" chapter of Twilight of the Idols). That Bruce finds a naked woman sexually arousing does not mean that he is committed to believing that naked women ought to command such a response, nor does it mean that his pleasurable arousal is only a matter of the instrumental value of naked women. We need clear textual evidence that Nietzsche thinks aesthetic experience is different.

Poellner's thesis that, for Nietzsche, the "grounds" of "ethical" value judgments "are ultimately located in experiences which are aesthetic" (62) is an attractive one, but what renders his view distinctive, and to my mind less plausible, is what he says about aesthetic value. On the one hand, as we have seen, Poellner views aesthetic experiences as affectivebut he has a very particular (and, in my view, unNietzschean) cognitivist view of affects:

affective experiences are essentially intentional or representational . . . Affective experience represents these objects under value aspects; grief represents an event as sad (in a specific way), indignation as unjust or immoral, disgust represents its object as nauseous, sexual desire as physically attractive, "aesthetic" contemplative pleasure as beautiful or perhaps harmonious . . . [Thus] in saying that some affects represent putative value features of objects, we are saying that, being intentional, they have conditions of success. My grief or horror or fear may turn out to have been misplaced, inappropriate, to have misrepresented the object. (63-64)

In his radical cognitivism about the emotions, Poellner has, I believe, gone beyond anything that Nietzsche's texts would warrant. We can agree, for example, that affective experiences have intentional objects (if I'm afraid, I'm [typically] afraid of something!), without agreeing that such experiences "represent these objects under value aspects": the death of a loved one may cause my grief -- an affect which has as its object his death -- but that does not mean my feeling "represents" his death "as sad": it just means that I feel sad about his death. But Poellner needs a stronger claim, since he wants to say that my emotions, "in being intentional . . . have conditions of success" (64), that is, my grief could be false, because the death is not, in fact, sad. Poellner asserts that the "bodily sensations" of fear, for example, are caused by the representation of what is fearful, rather than being the cause of the feeling (64), but this is empirically false (Prinz 2007: 56-60). Poellner sometimes cites Peter Goldie, but Goldie warned us, correctly, against stripping the feeling out of emotions, even if they have intentional objects (he proposed instead a primitive mental state, "feeling towards," to capture what is at stake). Poellner is always philosophically well-informed and intelligent, but I am not persuaded that the texts support the view he articulates, and I am also not persuaded that it represents the most promising view of emotions.

Of the three essays on moral psychology, Anderson's and Janaway's are most explicitly concerned with reconciling normativity and Nietzsche's naturalism. Anderson usefully focuses the issue by considering what kind of "self" the naturalist can recognize, contrasting that account with the kind a Kantian might endorse. On the naturalist view I defend, which Anderson succinctly describes, "what speaks for 'the self' is nothing but the strongest or dominant drive" (205). Anderson, reasonably, uses Gardner (2009) as the Kantian foil, and then identifies some apt naturalist rejoinders (206). Anderson, however, wants to defend what he thinks of as an intermediate view: "the Nietzschean self is not simply given as standard metaphysical equipment in every human, but is rather some kind of task or achievement" (208). And the crucial claim is that this kind of self "is separable from its constituent attitudes, in the sense of having the capacity to stand back from them to assess them, endorse them or reject them, 'control', and 'dispose of' them [quoting Nietzsche]" (210-11), and thus has a kind of "autonomy."

Anderson proceeds mainly by focusing on one passage, Beyond Good and Evil, section 12. (He allows that "some texts and notes in Nietzsche do suggest the sort of stronger [psychologistic] reduction or elimination of the self that" he denies is found in this passage, but thinks these other passages "are hyperbolic and do not reflect Nietzsche's considered position" [211 n. 17].) Anderson emphasizes (212-13) that Nietzsche's target in this passage is psychological atomism, meaning that "every drive or affect is [also] open to analysis that would reveal a complex internal structure composed of further drive- or affect-shaped substructures" (214). But this is not quite what the passage says: the passage says soul atomism is the doctrine that "the soul is something indestructible, eternal, indivisible, that it is a monad." This would be compatible with Nietzsche's thinking of drives (rather than the soul) as explanatory of the self -- something Anderson denies, even though Nietzsche specifically mentions in the passage at issue the idea of the self as "social structure of the drives and affects," making the latter sound like "atoms" in the sense Anderson's Nietzsche allegedly rejects. Part of the difficulty here, I think, is that Anderson does not realize the passage's target (the "clumsy naturalist[]") is clearly Ludwig Büchner's Kraft und Stoff, in particular its embrace of eliminative materialism (indeed, later in the book [sec. 204], Nietzsche specifically casts aspersions on "old doctors," meaning Büchner, who was a physician by training and well on in years by then). By contrast, Nietzsche is, of course, committed to the reality of psychological phenomena -- psychology is, after all, to be restored as "the queen of the sciences" as he says at the end of the first chapter of Beyond Good and Evil -- and so Nietzsche's opponent is not the kind of Humean that Anderson opposes, but an actual eliminativist about the mental. I am inclined to think that Nietzsche does reject both eliminativism and physical reductionism about the psychological, but neither is at stake for the kind of skeptical view of the self that Nietzsche holds, which requires the autonomy of the psychological as an explanatory realm.

Janaway, in a carefully argued essay, takes up the question: what is the relationship between being able to affirm the eternal return of one's life, the idea of a "great" human being, and Nietzsche's philosophical psychology, in particular, his account of the role of drives? Janaway correctly notes that Nietzsche's actual formulations of the idea of eternal return (for example, in Gay Science, section 341 and Beyond Good and Evil, section 56) do "not . . . say how one ought to live" (184); rather they say that "it would show that you were well-disposed to yourself to the highest degree possible" if you could affirm the eternal return, and thus Nietzsche is simply "trying to describe what it would be to be this ideal type of individual" (184). Janaway, like Railton, wonders whether such an ideal could really have "no normative implications?" (184). That may depend, of course, on what great human beings are like, and so here Janaway turns to what Nietzsche says about philosophical psychology. He largely follows the account of drives in Katsafanas (2013), though with a slight modification that need not concern us here:

a drive is a relatively enduring disposition of which the agent may be ignorant, but which, even when the agent has some awareness of it, operates in a manner outside the agent's full rational or conscious control, and which disposes the agent to evaluate things in ways that give rise to certain kinds of behavior. (187)

Janaway thinks that drives "are not necessarily immutable givens of human nature," and are "responsive to modification by cultural means" (189). His evidence is ambiguous, especially on the first point, though it seems right that drives can be modified on the Nietzschean picture (and the Freudian one, which Nietzsche influenced): they can be repressed, sublimated, weakened, strengthened and so on. The crucial claim is that, for Nietzsche, the "highest human being" will have "a multiplicity of conflicting but unified" drives (191), a point which seems true to Nietzsche's rhetoric but not very illuminating otherwise.

Janaway's central question, however, is how to understand the relationship between the idea that "one is great because one is, to a high degree, positively disposed towards oneself" (i.e., willing to will the eternal return of one's life) and the idea that "human greatness has as its condition certain internal properties and relations of drives that pertain whether one knows it or not" (192). Let us call the first "the Eternal Return Criterion" and the latter the "Internal Coherence Criterion" (these are my terms, not Janaway's). Both criteria have textual support in Nietzsche, and Janaway's question is about their connection. He notes (192) John Richardson's view that, essentially, the Internal Coherence Criterion must be satisfied in order for the Eternal Return Criterion to be satisfied (no one can will the eternal return unless one is already internally coherent): thus Internal Coherence is primary. Janaway, by contrast, defends the view that affirming the eternal return "might in addition cause alterations to our drives and their relations to one another in a such a way as to move them nearer to" satisfying the Internal Coherence Criterion (195). That could be true, and yet it might still be the case that the ability to begin willing the eternal return is, itself, causally determined by a certain psychological condition the agent is already in. Nothing Janaway says rules out that possibility, thus it is possible that willing the eternal return may have a causal influence on achieving internal coherence, but the fact that is true of any agent may simply be antecedently determined by other psycho-physical facts about the person.

Reginster's contribution has nothing to say about naturalism, and is focused squarely on an interpretive issue. Reginster wants to understand why, exactly, Nietzsche thought that "compassion . . . fosters selflessness, understood as a kind of self-devaluation" (160) and, more precisely, why Nietzsche thinks "selflessness" is "actually incompatible" with altruism (or compassion) (161). The key, Reginster argues, is to understand how Schopenhauer thought about altruism, and, to that end, he offers a skillful and illuminating account of Schopenhauer's treatment of the "problem of altruism" (162). For Schopenhauer, the egoist "cares only about his own interests because he fails to recognize or appreciate fully the reality of others with interests of their own" (163). Egoism is unsurprising, since "follow[ing] in a venerable Cartesian tradition," Schopenhauer supposes that it follows from the "special 'immediate' or 'direct' knowledge [that I have] of myself" (164) and thus "the personal significance my interests have for me is ultimately nothing more than an effect of my epistemic proximity to them; that is to say, a kind of illusion" (166). The challenge, then, for the possibility of compassion is how one can "have as direct an acquaintance with the interests of others as I have with my own" (166). The most common answer is that failure of compassion is a result of being "duped by the illusion of individuation" (167), though Reginster identifies some difficulties with one way of understanding that claim (167-169). He argues, instead, that for Schopenhauer, "compassion rests on a dissolution of the boundaries of individuation: it is not that I mistakenly take others to be part of me [which would simply make altruism a kind of egoism]it is rather that there is no me and them any longer" (170). It is not, then, that I come to identify with others -- that still presupposes "me and them" -- but that I lose all sense of a distinction between me and them. When I am conscious of my self, I am conscious of my will (or willing), and thus, to no longer experience one's self -- "selflessness" -- would "designate a certain kind of experience, in which an individual loses his sense of self to become absorbed in the pure contemplation of a world in which he has lost all interest" (173).

On Reginster's telling, Nietzsche's crucial objection to Schopenhauer is that this kind of "selfless" person can not really manifest altruistic concern for another, since "all that remains, and all that matters, in this perspective, is suffering . . . it matter not at all that it is located in this or that region of time and space: his sole concern is with de-individuated suffering" (179). By contrast, a genuine altruist has to have a sense of the difference between "me" and "them," and has to take seriously the idea that interests count simply because they are "mine" or "theirs": the real altruist would then act for the sake of the interests of others, recognizing them as important just because they are their interests (180-81).

What, finally, of the "naturalism" advertised in the volume's title? Several of the essays simply take for granted my account of Nietzsche's naturalism (Leiter 2002), though the editors in their useful introduction, unsurprisingly, rehearse some of Janaway's earlier criticisms of that account (Janaway 2007), though without noting the ways in which these criticisms involved confusions about or misrepresentations of my position (see Leiter 2013 and my earlier review of Janaway [2007] for NDPR [Leiter 2008]). As an alternative, the editors invoke a rather superficial essay on Nietzsche by Bernard Williams (1995), which is notable mainly for its lack of precision about what naturalism means. (Had it not been written by a "famous" philosopher, I doubt anyone would still be discussing this slight essay some two decades later.)

Thus, the editors write that Nietzsche "attempts to interpret human experiences in a way that is 'consistent with . . . our understanding of humans as part of nature'" (6, quoting Williams 1995: 67). "Consistency" is a very weak constraint on theorizing, but even so, its meaning is unclear without an account of what "part of nature" means. Hegel, after all, had an account of humans as "part of nature" as he understood nature, but he is not (one hopes) a naturalist. All that Williams offers (which the editors again quote [6]) is the stricture that we should prefer explanatory "account[s] that rest only on conceptions that we use anyway elsewhere" (1995: 68). "Anyway elsewhere," I take it, means that we should prefer causal explanations that rely on mechanisms identified by the sciences in other domains and that invoke properties that are explanatorily consilient, in the sense that they make sense of other features of the world (for this way of understanding naturalism, see Leiter 2001, 2013). Why the editors think this is an improvement over the "methodological naturalism" I attribute to Nietzsche is, I confess, mysterious.[1]

The one essay in the volume focused on the topic of naturalism, by Schacht, is also, unfortunately, the least satisfying in the book. Schacht begins by giving a fair summary of my view of Nietzsche's methodological naturalism: Leiter

characterizes the 'methodological doctrine' as the view that 'philosophical inquiry should be continuous with the sciences' (Leiter 2002: 3); that is, "continuous with the sciences either in virtue of their dependence upon the actual results of scientific method in different domains or in virtue of their employment and emulation of distinctively scientific ways of looking at and explaining things (Leiter 2002: 5, emphases added). (238)

Despite quoting me accurately, Schacht immediately and persistently mischaracterizes this as meaning natural science (24) or "scientistically reductionist" (242). Yet my account of Nietzsche's naturalism is explicit that Nietzsche

aims to offer theories that explain various important human phenomena (especially the phenomenon of morality), and [to] do so in ways that both draw on actual scientific results, particularly in physiology . . . , but are also modeled [speculatively] on science in the sense that they seek to reveal the causal determinants of these phenomena, typically in various physiological and psychological facts about persons" (Leiter 2002: 8, emphases added).

Schacht apparently does not understand that a naturalistic explanation, modeled on the sciences, does not have to be a reductive materialist explanation, a kind of explanation which Schacht points out (citing Gay Science 373) Nietzsche rejected (241). Unnoted by Schacht is that I adduced the exact same passage (Leiter 2002: 25) to make the same point, namely, that Nietzsche is not a reductive materialist/naturalist. If one claims Nietzsche (or Hume or Spinoza or Quine) is a naturalist, one has to offer some account of naturalism. Schacht purports to reject mine (even while making a hash of it), and then offers in its stead vague pronouncements like Nietzsche's naturalism "is attentive and attuned to the full panoply . . . of our human reality and world, and it is determined to make sense of both its richness and its emergence" (241) and that it "involves employing and drawing upon a multiplicity of differing perspectives, 'optics' and sensibilities in its interpretive attempt to broaden and deepen our understanding of ourselves" (242). Everyone would be a naturalist on this view, except some physicalists like Quine.

On the understanding of Nietzsche's naturalism, then, this volume offers little of interest: the explicit discussions are either fleeting or vacuous. But in terms of thinking about his metaethics, his moral psychology, and his critique of morality and normativity within a broadly naturalistic framework, the volume is an excellent contribution, and several of the essays will, I expect, become widely discussed in the secondary literature.


Clark, Maudemarie and David Dudrick. 2007. "Nietzsche and Moral Objectivity: The Development of Nietzsche's Metaethics," in Leiter and Sinhababu.

Gardner, Sebastian. 2009. "Nietzsche, the Self, and the Disunity of Philosophical Reason," in K. Gemes and S. May (eds.), Nietzsche on Freedom and Autonomy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Gemes, Ken and John Richardson (eds.). 2013. The Oxford Handbook of Nietzsche. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Hussain, Nadeem. 2013. "Nietzsche's Metaethical Stance," in Gemes and Richardson.

Janaway, Christopher. 2007. Beyond Selflessness. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Katsfanas, Paul. 2013. "Nietzsche's Philosophical Psychology," in Gemes and Richardson (2013).

Langsam, Harold. 1997. "How to Combat Nihilism: Reflections on Nietzsche's Critique of Morality,"History of Philosophy Quarterly 14: 235-253.

Leiter, Brian. 2000. "Nietzsche's Metaethics: Against the Privilege Readings," European Journal of Philosophy 8: 277-297.

---. 2001. "Moral Facts and Best Explanations," Social Philosophy and Policy 18: 79-101.

---. 2002. Nietzsche on Morality. London: Routledge.

---. 2008. Review of Christopher Janaway, Beyond Selflessness: Reading Nietzsche's GenealogyNotre Dame Philosophical Reviews 2008.06.03.

---. 2013. "Nietzsche's Naturalism Reconsidered," in Gemes and Richardson.

Leiter, Brian and Neil Sinhababu (eds.). 2007. Nietzsche and Morality. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Prinz, Jesse. 20007. The Emotional Construction of Morals. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Williams, Bernard. 1995. "Nietzsche's Minimalist Moral Psychology," reprinted in his Making Sense of Humanity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

[1]The editors also repeatedly confuse what their friends in the south of England think with the state of scholarly debate, pronouncing various interpretive lines (basically Janaway’s) as what “many” take to be the case (6) or what is allegedly “the more common interpretative line” (7 n. 3).  Philosophy “by head count” is neither satisfying nor interesting.