Nietzsche on Art and Life

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Daniel Came (ed.), Nietzsche on Art and Life, Oxford University Press, 2014, 255pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199545964.

Reviewed by Matthew Meyer, The University of Scranton


This collection comes with high expectations. Not only has Came published important papers on the topic,[1] the contributors he has assembled include some of the leading figures in the field. With a number of substantive essays well worth engaging, the volume largely lives up to these expectations. However, it does omit some important aspects of Nietzsche's understanding of art and its capacity to affirm life, and so it seems to fall short of the promise, on the back cover, to discuss "all of the major themes of Nietzsche's aesthetics." In what follows, I explain the ways in which the volume advances our understanding of Nietzsche, engage in some critical analysis of specific claims put forth by the contributors, and identify the aspects of Nietzsche's aesthetics the volume neglects.

Came rightly notes that Nietzsche is not interested in art per se but rather in its relation to life and the potential role it can play in affirming life, and it is to these topics that the volume is dedicated (1). As such, it serves as a corrective to the tendency of Anglophone scholars to downplay the primacy of Nietzsche's "practical-existential orientation" (2) and to interpret his writings in isolation from his views on art (3). One upshot of Came's approach is that it reveals a deeper continuity between Nietzsche's early and later writings than some have claimed. Whereas Nietzsche's views on metaphysics and epistemology seem to undergo a process of maturation, his views on the role that art plays in the affirmation of life seem to remain more consistent throughout his productive career. As Ken Gemes and Chris Sykes note at the beginning of their essay, Came's own scholarship has shown that there is a thematic continuity between an early work like The Birth of Tragedy (BT) and Nietzsche's more canonical works like Beyond Good and Evil and On the Genealogy of Morality (GM) (80).

To be sure, the volume covers a broad range of themes. Whereas Sabina Lovibond discusses matters of taste and distance in The Gay Science, Beyond Good and Evil, and Twilight of the Idols, Came' himself addresses the relationship between ethical and aesthetic value across Nietzsche's oeuvre. Adrian del Caro explores romanticism and classicism through a comparison of Nietzsche's Thus Spoke Zarathustra with Goethe's Faust, and Stephen Mulhall examines the form of The Birth of Tragedy, presenting the work as a site for a "three-cornered conversation" between Aeschylus, Wagner, and Schopenhauer (108). Although I do have reservations about certain aspects of Mulhall's interpretation, such as his view that Socrates is a mask of Apollo, each of these essays sheds important light on Nietzsche's understanding of art and life, and therefore each makes a valuable contribution.

Christopher Raymond situates The Birth of Tragedy in a conversation about tragedy that dates back to Plato's Republic. Raymond rightly argues that the originality of The Birth of Tragedy is that Nietzsche responds to Plato's expulsion of the poets in the Republic not by showing that art meets the ethical and epistemic criteria that Plato establishes as grounds for their re-admittance -- this is what Aristotle and Schiller try to do -- but rather by rejecting these very criteria. As Raymond explains, Nietzsche argues that art is important not because it makes us ethically better or provides us with more knowledge, but because it enables us to affirm life once the Socratic quest for happiness -- as well as the moral, political, and philosophical project that arises from it -- is shown to be a baseless myth.

Another refreshing feature of the volume is the way in which a number of the contributors read Nietzsche in conversation with Schopenhauer, something that was more the exception than the rule only a few decades ago. Indeed, A. E. Denham argues that Nietzsche is even more indebted to Schopenhauer than is typically recognized. On the standard reading, Nietzsche rejects Schopenhauer's account of aesthetic experience. According to Denham, Nietzsche does reject the normative implications that Schopenhauer draws from aesthetic experience, but his understanding of aesthetic experience is nevertheless "continuous with Schopenhauer's own" (164). Although some might resist some of Denham's conclusions, the essay provides a detailed analysis of Schopenhauer's and Nietzsche's aesthetics that is well worth engaging.

Nietzsche's relationship to Schopenhauer also plays an important role in Ken Gemes and Chris Sykes' contribution, "Nietzsche's Illusion." However, the authors try to distance Nietzsche from Schopenhauer on a couple of points. On the one hand, they argue that the young Nietzsche "was never seriously wedded to Schopenhauer's metaphysics of the will as thing-in-itself" in The Birth of Tragedy (80). On the other hand, they claim that Nietzsche's primary concern was not the problem of suffering, as it was for Schopenhauer, but rather the meaninglessness of suffering and life (81). To address this problem, Nietzsche is said to follow Wagner, rather than Schopenhauer, in holding that illusion (Wahn), in the form of a "self-consciously constructed mythology," is needed to affirm life (81), and this, the authors argue, is a project Nietzsche pursues throughout his productive career.

Bernard Reginster's essay, "Art and Affirmation," also centers on the role that illusions, in particular beautiful illusions, play in Nietzsche's early project of life affirmation. Reginster, however, diverges from Gemes and Sykes' account on two points: first, he holds that the problem of suffering is Nietzsche's primary concern (15); second, he argues that there is a difference between Nietzsche's early and late works regarding the way in which beauty can affirm a life so characterized (14). According to Reginster, "the central message of The Birth of Tragedy is that the affirmation of life requires 'illusion [Illusion]', which allows us to 'forget' the displeasure caused by 'the weight and burden of existence'" (15). However, Nietzsche eventually comes to doubt the idea that beautiful illusions can underwrite a genuine affirmation (23). For a genuine affirmation, it is necessary to confront and affirm the terrifying and questionable aspects of existence. According to Reginster, the mature Nietzsche tries to resolve this issue through his concept of the will to power as the overcoming of resistance, one that makes suffering a constituent feature of happiness (26). Reginster ends by discussing further differences between Nietzsche's earlier and later understandings of beauty and artistic affirmation, claiming that, for the mature Nietzsche, tragedy incites us to engage with life and in creative activity rather than producing a deceptive and comforting view of life, as Nietzsche had claimed in his earlier works (34).

The focus on the relationship between artistic beauty, on the one hand, and truth, on the other hand, continues in Christopher Janaway's contribution. He begins by disputing the claims put forth by Reginster in his 2006 book, The Affirmation of Life,[2] and further defended in this volume[3] that affirmation in The Birth of Tragedy depends largely on beautiful illusions, so that there is a disparity between affirmation in Nietzsche's early and late works. According to Janaway, Reginster's 2006 account relies primarily on an Apollonian conception of art that affirms life through beautiful illusions (40). In contrast to Reginster, who follows Gemes and Sykes in arguing that the tragic itself is a form of illusion (see BT 18),[4] Janaway holds that Nietzsche endorses a Dionysian affirmation of Dionysian truth. Thus, Janaway claims that the satyr chorus of dithyrambic art allows one "to live with the truth by confronting it in an affirmative frame of mind, not to live in spite of the truth by veiling it over" (45). In the latter half of his essay, Janaway explores Nietzsche's views on the relationship between art and truth, correctly noting that Nietzsche's early critique of Socratism prefigures his later questioning of the will to truth (47).

Although Janaway rightly points to the way in which Dionysian art can affirm the truth without illusion, it is surprising that there is little discussion in the volume about two concepts that are crucial to Nietzsche's understanding of this phenomenon, namely, musical dissonance and play. Play is important for Nietzsche because it reveals the joy we can take in both creation and destruction and so enables us to affirm the ugly and disharmonic elements of the world. Although Gemes and Sykes refer to play in a passage they quote from Wagner, they do so to argue the larger point that Nietzsche follows Wagner in holding that Wahn is necessary to make life bearable. However, the point Wagner seems to be making is that art is a "life-saviour" not because it produces illusions, but rather because it shows life itself to be an illusion, and by showing life to be a "Wahn-picture," art allows us to experience life as a "game of play" (99).

Reginster also refers to play, but he argues that it is only possible "through a kind of deception or detachment" in that it requires us to identify exclusively with "primordial Oneness" and so to see ourselves "as other than we empirically are" (22). Reginster's argument, however, presupposes that our empirically individuated selves function as a standard of reality that art distorts by overcoming the principle of individuation, and this conflicts with the metaphysical picture Nietzsche sketches in the opening sections of The Birth of Tragedy. Although Gemes and Sykes have cast doubt on Nietzsche's commitment to the Schopenhauerian metaphysics employed in the work, Nietzsche also associates the concept of play with the anti-metaphysical, naturalized ontology he attributes to Heraclitus in Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks in which individuals, like commonsense things, lack any fundamental reality. Not only is there good reason to think the mature Nietzsche remains true to this Heraclitean ontology, scholars such as Günter Wohlfart have shown how the concept of play appears in Nietzsche's later works,[5] and it is for this reason that interpreters such as Eugen Fink and Lawrence Hinman have argued that play is central to Nietzsche's entire project.[6]

Nietzsche's discussion of musical dissonance in the penultimate section of The Birth of Tragedy may be even more important in this context for two reasons. First, it is free from the metaphysical baggage that Nietzsche initially associates with the concept of play. Second, it arguably prefigures Reginster's understanding of the will to power as the overcoming of resistance. The idea is that both musical dissonance and the willing of power combine pleasure and pain and so both seem to enable the affirmation of the ugly and disharmonic elements of existence (BT 24). If this is right, one could argue that it was the experience of Wagner's Tristan chord that first revealed to Nietzsche how we can take pleasure in the pain of insatiable longing and so affirm a life that is essentially suffering.

Although there is no discussion of the Tristan chord, the volume does conclude with two contributions devoted exclusively to music. In the penultimate essay, Aaron Ridley emphasizes the central place that music has in Nietzsche's philosophy: "Music and conceptions of music run through and up and down Nietzsche's philosophy in a way that is true of no one else's" (220). Ridley first examines Nietzsche's own musical tastes, arguing that Nietzsche was a conservative on such matters (222). He then claims that Nietzsche was immersed in the Romantic spirit of the time insofar as he held that music is immediately related to the essence of life and so music is the most important of the arts (224). After explaining how Nietzsche saw his own philosophy as a sort of music and examining Nietzsche's eventual rejection of Wagner's Parsifal in favor of Bizet's Carmen, Ridley concludes by arguing that because Nietzsche saw in music the potential to "redeem the world" and so save us from the nihilism of modernity, it would not be wrong to say that, for him, "the 'fate of music' is intimately tied up with the fate of the world itself" (233).

In the final essay, Roger Scruton explores Nietzsche's relationship to Wagner, prefacing his discussion with the claim that Nietzsche's divorce from Wagner needs "to be discerned within a cloud of self-loathing" (236). After sketching the argument of The Birth of Tragedy, Scruton explains the philosophical differences that ultimately separated Nietzsche from Wagner. Whereas Wagner followed Schopenhauer in understanding redemption to be a form of renunciation, Nietzsche opposed this "sick" longing for death with a "healthy" affirmation of the self and life. Thus, the goal of Nietzsche's 1888 The Case of Wagner is "to reject Wagner's moral vision, and also to suggest that the attempt to build that vision into a sustained work of art leads to music that is fundamentally sick" (243).

Although Nietzsche is right, in Scruton's view, to assess music according to moral categories, he argues that Nietzsche fails to show that "the Wagnerian philosophy of redemption is either decadent in itself or aesthetically destructive" (243). Indeed, Scruton not only argues that Nietzsche fails to make this case but also responds to the insults Nietzsche hurls at Wagner with some insults of his own. Thus, Scruton claims that Nietzsche's own advocacy of "life" is "at best an excusable compensation for the invalid existence that the philosopher was obliged to lead, at worst a surrender to all that is most destructive in human nature" (248), and so Scruton concludes that it is "far more obviously a sham . . . than Wagner's post-Christian philosophy of redemption" (250).

Scruton's essay is certainly engaging. However, I find his ad hominem responses to Nietzsche a bit disappointing, perhaps even comical. This is because I read The Case of Wagner as a farce[7] and so part of a comic agon that Nietzsche enacts in his 1888 works, one that follows in the tradition of Aristophanic comedy of employing ad hominem insults to taunt artistic, political, and cultural rivals.[8] If this is right, then Scruton's own barbs only seem to continue the comic performance but in a way that is lost on Scruton. This is not to say that Nietzsche's final works lack a serious message or that his ideas should be immune to criticism. It is, however, to say that it would behoove readers to consider the possibility that Nietzsche's references to "jokes" and "pure malice" in the preface of The Case of Wagner are subtle hints that his critique of Wagner, like his critique of Christian morality, is part of his own Dionysian comedy (GM Pref 7).

Even if I am wrong to read The Case of Wagner in this way, I am certainly not alone in highlighting the importance that laughter and comedy play in Nietzsche's later writings. For instance, Lawrence Hatab devotes the epilogue of his book on the eternal recurrence to highlighting "the force of comic laughter in Nietzsche's thought,"[9] Christine Battersby has discussed Nietzsche's role as Hanswurst in his later writings,[10] and Nicholas More has recently argued that Ecce Homo is satire.[11] In contrast, the present volume contains only one footnote on comedy in Plato (57n.1) and two references to laughter: whereas Lovibond briefly discusses Nietzsche's hope that future philosophers will overcome the "disabling heaviness" of past philosophy (202), Reginster cites the all-important conclusion of the 1886 preface to The Birth of Tragedy in which Nietzsche calls upon higher men to learn the this-worldly comfort of laughter (BT Pref 7) (22).

To conclude, this volume is an excellent collection of substantive essays by seasoned scholars on the topic of art and life in Nietzsche, and it marks an important step in reading Nietzsche's project through his "practical-existential orientation," rather than "the contemporary concerns of metaphysicians, epistemologists, and ethicists" (2). However, the focus on themes such as truth, illusion, value, and beauty and the relative neglect of topics such as musical dissonance, play, laughter, and comedy do leave one wondering if the treatment of Nietzsche on art and life offered in this volume is still not subtly guided and so constrained by the very sociological forces in Anglophone Nietzsche scholarship that Came rightly identifies and ultimately hopes to overcome.

[1] See, for instance: "The Aesthetic Justification of Existence," in A Companion to Nietzsche, ed. K. Ansell-Pearson, 41-57 (Oxford: Blackwell, 2006) and "The Themes of Affirmation and Illusion in The Birth of Tragedy and Beyond," in The Oxford Handbook of Nietzsche, ed. K. Gemes and J. Richardson, 209-225 (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2013).

[2] Bernard Reginster, The Affirmation of Life: Nietzsche on Overcoming Nihilism (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2006).

[3] However, Janaway does note that the more detailed reading of The Birth of Tragedy Reginster offers in the present volume reveals a good measure of agreement (41n.5).

[4] Came, "The Themes of Affirmation and Illusion," also appeals to the beginning of BT 18 to support this point (212), and eventually to conclude that, "the Dionysian too is itself inseparable from illusion" (223). For my part, I see how music and dance -- the Dionysian arts par excellence -- can create and even lend significance to illusions, but I do not see how music and dance themselves affirm life through illusions. Thus, I side with Janaway in thinking that the Dionysian arts of music and dance provide an illusion-free affirmation of Dionysian truth and so in holding that although tragedy does affirm life through illusions, it also affirms life through the intoxication (Rausch) and play that Nietzsche associates with the Dionysian arts.

[5] Günter Wohlfart, "Also Sprach Herakleitos": Heraklits Fragment B 52 und Nietzsches Heraklit-Rezeption (Munich: Karl Alber Freiburg, 1991).

[6] Eugen Fink, Nietzsche's Philosophy, trans. G. Richter (London: Continuum, 2003) and Lawrence M. Hinman, "Nietzsche's Philosophy of Play," in Philosophy Today 18(2) (1974): 106-124.

[7] Nietzsche refers to the work as a "Farce" in a letter to Naumann on 7 September 1888 and a "Posse" in another letter to Naumann on 15 December 1888.

[8] Matthew Meyer, "The Comic Nature of Ecce Homo," in The Journal of Nietzsche Studies 43(1) (2012): 32-43.

[9] Lawrence J. Hatab, Nietzsche's Life Sentence: Coming to Terms with Eternal Recurrence (London: Routledge, 2005), 155.

[10] Christine Battersby, "'Behold the Buffoon': Dada, Nietzsche's Ecce Homo and the Sublime," in Nigel Llewellyn and Christine Riding (eds.), The Art of the Sublime, January 2013, accessed 17 December 2014.

[11] Nicholas More, Nietzsche's Last Laugh: Ecce Homo as Satire (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2014).