Nietzsche on Consciousness and the Embodied Mind,

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Manuel Dries (ed.), Nietzsche on Consciousness and the Embodied Mind, De Gruyter, 2018, 350pp., $114.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783110246520.

Reviewed by Jonathan Mitchell, University of Manchester


In recent years, the gold-standard for edited collections on Nietzsche's work has been the Oxford University Press volumes.[1] One feature of those is thematic unity -- the essays make sense and reward being read together. Further, there is a broad philosophical style and background the authors share. The present volume, unfortunately, falls short of that standard.

The title -- Nietzsche on Consciousness and the Embodied Mind -- is slightly misleading since a number of the sixteen papers do not primarily engage with Nietzsche's views on consciousness, the embodied mind, or contemporary debates on these matters. Moreover, the volume includes contributors whose style and philosophical background markedly differ. This would not be a problem if the contributions were focused on similar issues. However, as the volume progresses it largely departs from the themes of the title and becomes concerned with a wide range of topics in Nietzsche scholarship. For example, the final three sections 'Towards Naturalism', 'Ethics and "Life"' and "Redlichkeit and Embodied Wisdom', while interesting, have little substantive connection with Nietzsche's views concerning consciousness. The papers in the interim sections, 'Mind, Metaphysics, and Will to Power' and 'Consciousness, Language, and Metaphor' connect more with the themes of the title, but the contributions therein are highly discursive. That being said, the first two sections -- 'Embodied Cognition and Eliminative Materialism' and 'Consciousness and Freedom of the Will' -- include papers that are significant. In this review, I pay detailed attention to three of these (which I consider the best papers in the volume).

The first paper I focus on is Christa Davis Acampora's 'Nietzsche and Embodied Cognition'. Its aim is to survey connections between Nietzsche's thought and developments in embodied cognition. The latter views, broadly, aim to put the body and its interaction with the environment -- so notions of sensation, action, and agency -- at the centre of cognitive processes. Such views are often set in opposition to brain-based models of cognition, understood in largely non-bodily terms, for example, computational views which (roughly) understand cognitive processing in terms of abstract symbol manipulation. Acampora surveys these views in an informative way.

However, what does this have to do with Nietzsche? One point which Acampora emphasises in the context of extended cognition (a view which suggests that human cognition extends beyond both the 'skull' and the 'body' to environmental objects) is the blurring of the boundaries of the self and agency, something she claims Nietzsche was partial to (citing GS 109 and BGE 230). A more direct connection is the emphasis on the importance of the body. Let me highlight one of the interesting points Acampora makes in this context.

Nietzsche holds that there is often a 'metaphorical transference' from bodily experiences to abstract concepts, specifically those we apply in the case of mentality. The idea is that our primary experiential contact with the world is bodily and agential and that our abstract concepts are 'metaphorical elaborations' (or better, analogical reflections) of those experiences. As Acampora glosses this, 'Nietzsche repeatedly focuses on the process of applying or transferring one domain of experience, whether it is that of sensation, as the case may be for embodied cognition theorists, for example, to another domain, in the case in question, that of cognition' (p.30). Consider the following example concerning the concept of 'mental effort'. We might say the concept of 'mental effort' is based on an analogy ('metaphorical transference') with a kind of bodily-agential effort with which we are first-personally familiar. If someone were to ask, what-is-it-like to have to expend 'mental effort' we might say 'it's a bit like when you have to pick up something heavy: you have to try hard to do it'. So, there is an explanation about how a concept, say 'effort', gets its primary meaning from specific forms of bodily-agential experience, and then is used in a more 'metaphorical way' in a different context (e.g., mental effort).

One problem, however, is that we can seemingly provide these kinds of accounts without invoking any of the theoretical terminology of embodied cognition. Insofar as the explanation we give is couched in terms of first-person familiarity with a particular kind of bodily experience, then embodied cognition -- as concerned with subpersonal or typically non-conscious bodily-environment 'transactions' -- isn't all that relevant. This is important since, as Acampora notes, 'cognitive activity is not necessarily conscious for Nietzsche; indeed, very much of it may be unconscious, as suggested above in the discussion of metaphorical transference from one domain to another in our sense-making and world-making mental activities' (p.33). But it is just not obvious what -- in the above account -- is supposed to be unconscious and in what sense. And while Nietzsche places significant emphasis on the role of the unconscious, there is a difference between Nietzsche's idea of the unconscious, involving non-conscious analogs of a host of personal level states (e.g., desires, beliefs, affects, drives, etc.) and the kind of subpersonal cognitive activity relevant to embodied cognition theories.

As a final point on this contribution, the kind of conceptual shifts suggested by embodied cognition theories is, as Acampora notes, reminiscent of Nietzsche's aim to provide alternative characterizations of a range of important phenomenon where he thinks the concepts we have are deficient. She articulates this programmatic Nietzschean point as follows: insofar as we engage in such conceptual shifts, then 'more and different conceptual possibilities are open to us as well as different possibilities for characterizing and analysing relevant relations, some of which have momentous implications and real-world applications' (p.44).

The next contribution I focus on is Manuel Dries' 'Early Nietzsche on History, Embodiment, and Value'. While the majority of the contributions focus on Nietzsche's later works, or draw passages from across the corpus, this paper provides a new reading of central concepts in Nietzsche's second Untimely Meditation, 'On the Use and Disadvantage of History for Life' (HL). In HL, Nietzsche criticizes a specific character (in important respects similar to the 'last human being' from Thus Spoke Zarathustra), namely the so-called 'lastborn firstlings', whose supposed 'excess of history' gives rise to a specific failing. Their narrow obsession with a specific kind of 'historical sense' leads them to inertia or inaction, or affective disengagement. The originality of Dries' paper is in its appeal to two concepts from embodied cognition to explain what causes this 'modern historical sickness'.

The first of these is the 'overload hypothesis'. Here is how Dries glosses it: 'as the historical drive becomes increasingly hypertrophic and pathological, it generates much more data than can be processed by the self. These data are no longer embodied . . . this results in different kinds of self-system failure' (p.62). As Dries notes, this is reminiscent of the 'framing problem' in cognitive science: given a massive influx of information, a system needs some preference-based way of determining what does or does not matter -- failing that, the relevant computations would go on ad infinitum, resulting in inertia. Arguably, part of the explanation for the 'modern historical sickness' Nietzsche is interested in is analogous: the historical sense in and of itself does not provide any higher or guiding preference for determining what should matter but just promotes attention to a body of ever-growing data, which leads to cognitive 'overload'; with no way to decide what is relevant with respect to an ever-growing body of information, the 'lastborn firstlings' become inactive or affectively disengaged.

The above analysis foreshadows the next question Dries asks: 'how is it that selves know their environment in the meaningful way they do, that certain symbols and words are meaningful and not others' (p.63)? The answer considered relies on the concept of embodiment. Connecting notions in embodied cognition with Nietzsche's philosophical psychology of affects, drives, and values, Dries claims that

embodiment in Nietzsche . . . denotes both a self-system's incorporated drives and affects as well as its integration and embedding in its environment . . . [selves are] structurally coupled with their environment due to their inborn and acquired incorporated drives and affects that provide them with affective orientations, channels that embody or integrate them in the environment. (p.65)

With this picture in place, Dries suggests that the reason those 'last-born firstlings' cannot put their historical sense to use (in action) is that they are deficient with respect to embodiment. Dries calls the alternative positive state 'semantic embodiment': 'only if a self-system possesses an already existing, embodied experiential basis on which to build, can it . . . sustain a meaningful relationship with history' (p.65). So, another part of the explanation of the relevant inertia is that the 'last-born firstlings' lack the relevant lived experience or practical knowledge required for 'embodied semantics', which would allow them to put their 'historical sense' to use.

There is much in Dries' paper that is interesting; however, let me voice a concern. One might question whether an appeal to 'semantic embodiment' really solves the problem of determining what 'information' should count as meaningful for someone like Nietzsche. After all, the structures which ground what seems valuable and meaningful are in many cases based on quasi-religious socially-enshrined norms and morals (in the form of certain drives and affects) which are themselves to be criticised and re-valued. And when undertaking such a re-evaluation, wouldn't such an agent not know how to act? Further, couldn't we imagine an agent who enjoyed the kind of Nietzschean 'deep embodiment' Dries talks of -- having all the relevant lived experience and practical knowledge, and a properly-ordered drive psychology to match -- but whom nonetheless Nietzsche found objectionable on other grounds? There plausibly are agents who are comported to their environments in such a way as to be very successful 'in action', and whose drives and affects are fully integrated to their aims and goals, but who nonetheless would be subject to Nietzschean criticism on other non-formal substantive grounds (e.g., successful bureaucrats). More needs to be said about these potential conflicts.

Let me finally turn to 'Nietzsche on the Superficiality of Consciousness' by Mattia Riccardi. This paper is the highlight of the volume. The background motivation is an attempt to make sense of Nietzsche's statement that 'consciousness is a surface' (EH, Clever 9), which Riccardi parses as the claim that consciousness is in some sense superficial. This claim is then divided into two further theses which constitute the superficiality of consciousness: (1) consciousness is superfluous (SC for short): 'we can explain one's behaviour without appealing to consciousness' (p.93), therefore consciousness is causally otiose with respect to action-explanations; (2) consciousness falsifies (FC for short): 'far from revealing the motives of our actions, it rather tends to distort them' (p.93). The paper defends substantive articulations of these claims.

One central aspect of Riccardi's analysis is his clarification of what Nietzsche means by consciousness (specifically in GS 354). He argues that consciousness, for Nietzsche, refers to a specific kind of reflective self-consciousness, such that for a mental state to be conscious requires an accompanying higher-order representational state (e.g., a perception or thought) which takes the experience itself as an object.[2] Take a visual experience as of a red ball. For this experience to be conscious (on this kind of account), it is necessary that it is accompanied by the relevant higher-order representational state, say, a thought with the content 'I am having a visual experience as of a red ball'. This reading makes sense of key aspects of GS 354, where Nietzsche talks of the supposed 'mirroring' that goes on in consciousness.

On the basis of this clarification, Riccardi argues for FC as follows. Conscious states essentially include accompanying mental states expressible in propositional attitude reports (e.g., 'I believe I am having a visual experience as of a red ball'). According to Nietzsche, the folk-psychological categories and concepts deployed in such propositional attitudes are socially-mediated 'herd-perspectives' on our conscious lives, having developed to aid (linguistic) communication rather than accurately represent our 'inner experience'. As such, according to Riccardi, Nietzsche thinks that conceptualizing inner experience in line with such categories 'completely obscures their nature' (p.103). In addition to this, conscious states, including such higher-order thoughts, lead to a reification of the indexical "I". We take the grammatical "I" to refer to a metaphysically real substance which is the purported origin of our various mental states (a view Nietzsche is persistently critical of; see GM I 13). This analysis of FC is an important corrective to, and development of, Paul Katsafanas' claim that the sense in which consciousness falsifies for Nietzsche is by way of conceptualization per se.[3] Riccardi contrastingly claims that the relevant 'falsifying conceptualization' is that of 'socially mediated propositional articulation' (p.104). For the sake of brevity let me skip what Riccardi has to say by way of defence of SC, in favour of saying something broader about the view of Nietzsche's philosophy of mind Riccardi is recommending.

On Riccardi's analysis, when Nietzsche uses the term 'conscious' or 'consciousness' what he means is a mental state or experience accompanied by a higher-order thought. Yet one significant consequence of this is that it ostensibly broadens the scope of the label 'unconscious'. The class of 'unconscious' mental states would presumably include the majority of pre-reflective conscious experiences, such as perceptual, affective and conative experiences which don't necessarily (or even typically) include such higher-order thoughts. However, this seems to misplace the distinction. We don't want a view of mind (or even a view of Nietzsche on mind) which ends up claiming that typical perceptual or affective experiences are 'unconscious'. It seems preferable house-keeping to have unconscious states as those which, at least paradigmatically, lack phenomenal character.

One positive suggestion in this context is to talk of consciousness in the pejorative sense for Nietzsche. Let me explain. In Brian Leiter's analysis of Nietzsche on morality, he distinguished between 'morality' as a pejorative term used by Nietzsche to designate something he is definitively opposed to, and 'morality' in a non-pejorative sense (due to passages in which Nietzsche talks in more or less positive terms about 'higher' or 'different' moralities).[4] Arguably, a similar distinction would benefit discussions of Nietzsche on consciousness: we could talk about consciousness in the pejorative sense as the kind of 'reflective self-consciousness' that, on Riccardi's reading of Nietzsche, is falsifying, causally otiose, and arguably overvalued by some philosophers. Alternatively, talk of 'consciousness' or 'inner experience' might be maintained as something about which Nietzsche has much to say, as distinct from unconscious mental states or processes. Such a distinction would allow one to talk in more positive terms about what Nietzsche seems to value about consciousness, or at least a certain range of conscious experiences.[5]

Let me conclude by emphasizing that although I found the volume to be of mixed quality, the contributions I have highlighted are significant papers on Nietzsche and should be read with care by scholars.


Dries, M and Kail, P. (eds.) (2015) Nietzsche on Mind and Nature. Oxford University Press.

Janaway, C. and Robertson, S. (eds.) (2012) Nietzsche, Naturalism and Normativity. Oxford University Press.

Katsafanas, P. (2005) 'Nietzsche's Theory of Mind' in European Journal of Philosophy 13, 1-33.

Leiter, B. (2015) Nietzsche on Morality (second edition). Routledge.

Mitchell (2017) 'Nietzsche on Taste: Epistemic Privilege and Anti-Realism' in Inquiry 60 (1-2), 31-65.

Nietzsche, F. (1997) On the Genealogy of Morality. Ed. K.A. Pearson. Trans. C. Diethe. Cambridge University Press.

Nietzsche, F. (2001) The Gay Science. Ed. B. Williams. Trans. J. Nauckhoff. Cambridge University Press.

Nietzsche, F. (2002) Beyond Good and Evil. Ed. R.P. Horstmann and J. Norman. Trans. J. Norman. Cambridge University Press.

Nietzsche, F. (2005) Ecce Homo. Ed. A. Ridley and J. Norman. Trans. J. Norman. Cambridge University Press.

Nietzsche, F. (2005) Twilight of the Idols. Ed. A. Ridley and J. Norman. Trans. J. Norman. Cambridge University Press.

Poellner, P. (2007) 'Affect, Value and Objectivity' in B. Leiter and N. Sinhababu (eds.) Nietzsche and Morality, 227-261. Oxford University Press.

Poellner, P. (2012) 'Aestheticist Ethics' in C. Janaway and S. Roberston (eds.) Nietzsche, Naturalism and Normativity, 52-80, Oxford University Press.

Rosenthal, D.M. (1997) 'A Theory of Consciousness' in N. Block, O. Flanagan, and G. G├╝zeldere (eds.) The Nature of Consciousness: Philosophical Debates, 729-53. MIT Press.

[1] See, e.g., Janaway and Robertson (2012); Dries and Kail (2015).

[2] See Rosenthal 1997: 729-53 for the classic statement of this view in the contemporary literature.

[3] See Katsafanas 2005: 1-33.

[4] See Leiter 2015: Ch.3.

[5] This approach is more in keeping with Poellner 2007: 227-61; 2012: 52-80; Mitchell 2017: 31-65.