Nietzsche on Ethics and Politics

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Maudemarie Clark, Nietzsche on Ethics and Politics, Oxford University Press, 2015, 311pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199371846.

Reviewed by Neil Sinhababu, National University of Singapore


Nietzsche scholarship has made impressive progress over the last thirty years, with lots of excellent work now available to help puzzled readers understand Nietzsche's provocative and often beautiful writing. Maudemarie Clark's Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy was a big step forward in our understanding of his metaphysics and epistemology. Her Nietzsche on Ethics and Politics is a collection of fourteen essays mostly on Nietzsche's practical philosophy, ending with four on metaphysical issues that are related to the normative issues discussed earlier in the book. Most were published previously -- the oldest in 1987 and the newest in 2014 -- though two are revised versions of unpublished lectures and one is a remix of material from her recent book. Some appeared in obscure venues, so this volume helps readers access all of them.

A useful introduction discusses the contexts in which the essays were written and summarizes most of them. I recommend glancing at the discussion of each essay in the introduction before reading it. The historical context often helps readers better understand the essays. And as the beginnings of some essays only hint at their most exciting claims, the summaries in the introduction help readers know where they're going.

The first essay is "Nietzsche's Immoralism and the Concept of Morality". Clark notes that Nietzsche aptly called himself an immoralist and that his rejection of morality begins fairly early and becomes increasingly forceful in his later writings. She sees Nietzsche as understanding the essential nature of morality historically, in terms of the forces that came together to create it. I liked her remark that "Nietzsche's history of morality is a genealogy because it is the history of couplings" (31). She regards immoralism as a new way to combine some of these forces while excluding the ascetic ideal, which she interprets as essential to morality on Nietzsche's conception. The essay discusses how the various forces came together, considering the three essays of the Genealogy. Surprising aspects of her interpretation, such as the claim that the debtor-creditor relationship presupposes the concept of fairness, are recognized and ably defended. The essay was written over 20 years ago, and although much of the scholarship Clark responds to is even older, many of her insights can still lead us forward.

"On the Rejection of Morality: Bernard Williams's Debt to Nietzsche" picks up themes of the previous essay. Both Williams and Nietzsche reject morality in interesting ways that many readers would like to understand, and Clark does an admirable job of figuring out what both of them are up to. She finds the most deeply Nietzschean element of Williams' rejection of morality to be what he describes as "its insistence on abstracting the moral consciousness from other kinds of emotional reaction or social influence" (Williams 195). She sees this emphasis on the purity of moral motivation as an instance of the ascetic ideal, in how it involves valuing something separate from our other passions and the natural world. The essay engages deeply with contemporary moral theory, considering Samuel Scheffler's and Stephen Darwall's engagement with Williams. Admirers of Clark's work on Nietzsche may enjoy seeing her interpret contemporary philosophers. Particularly useful was the discussion of how Williams' rejection of moral obligation involves understanding it as an overpowering practical necessity that supposedly comes from outside the agent.

Clark's introduction describes "Nietzsche's Contribution to Ethics" as her "most complete and succinct account of Nietzsche's naturalistic account of the origins and development of morality" (5). Most of the essay consists in a clear and comprehensive reading of the Genealogy that stays close to the text and discusses many of its central ideas. Before that, Clark gives her clearest presentation of a distinction between "ethics" and "morality" that appears repeatedly in the preceding essays. She invokes Williams' (1995) account of ethics as "any scheme for regulating the relations between people that works through informal sanctions and internalized dispositions" (241), with morality being just one such scheme. This seemed to undermine her criticisms of Philippa Foot's interpretation, on which Nietzsche criticizes morality on aesthetic grounds. She says Foot's interpretation "shows no signs of appreciating that Nietzsche took morality to be only one of the possibilities for ethical life" (64). But aesthetic norms can regulate relations between people through informal sanctions and internalized dispositions. Obnoxious fashionable people sometimes publicly apply aesthetic norms to people's clothes, excluding the unfashionable from parties and making them ashamed of how they dress. So the aesthetic replacement for morality offered by Foot's Nietzsche might count as an ethics in Williams' sense after all. While this is a problem for Clark's criticisms of Foot in this essay and preceding ones, it's no problem for Clark's reading of the Genealogy, which I strongly recommend.

"Nietzsche on Free Will, Causality, and Responsibility" interprets Nietzsche as a compatibilist about free will and expresses a significant change from her earlier influential account of Nietzsche's metaphysics. She abandons her earlier interpretation on which Beyond Good and Evil 21 expresses a commitment to a neo-Kantian phenomenalism on which causal claims don't correspond to anything genuine about reality. (Part of the issue is whether "in itself" in that section refers to the Kantian thing-in-itself.) Her previous interpretation suggested that the rejection of "unfree will" along with "free will" in that section just involves rejecting causation in general and thus the causality of the will. Clark discusses Brian Leiter at length since he interprets the section along the lines she previously suggested in his defense of a hard determinist interpretation. Her new view is that Nietzsche wasn't expressing such skepticism about causation and that the rejection of both "free will" and "unfree will" is a rejection of both libertarianism and hard determinism. To my knowledge, Leiter hasn't addressed the way this change in her views affects his arguments. I'm curious about what he would say. Maybe the publication of this collection will move him to tell us. The essay ends with a helpful discussion of the Genealogy which engages with contemporary work on free will and outlines how Nietzsche might have us hold each other responsible for actions without any incompatibilist assumptions.

"Nietzsche on Moral Objectivity", co-authored with David Dudrick, addresses one of the most important and most-discussed questions in Nietzsche scholarship: how are Nietzsche's own evaluative claims compatible with his rejection of morality? Clark and Dudrick argue that after moving away from the error theory of Human, all-too-Human, Nietzsche accepted noncognitivism about morality from Gay Science forward. But the textual evidence they use to support the view (particularly from GS 299 and GS 301) is ambiguous between noncognitivism and views like subjectivism, which also seeks to retain evaluative language while denying the existence of objective moral facts. Moreover, neither section explicitly invokes moral values, with GS 299 only discussing beauty, attractiveness, and desirability. These problems and others regarding their discussion of objectivity have been noted in recent scholarship, particularly by Nadeem Hussain in "Nietzsche and Non-cognitivism". Perhaps in response to these criticisms, Clark writes in the introduction,

Dudrick and I argue for interpreting Nietzsche, from GS on, as a metaethical non-cognitivist. But our concern is not with the semantics for ethical discourse to which Nietzsche may be committed, but rather with how his view had changed concerning how ethics fits into the natural world, a world that does not contain any ethical facts or properties (9).

While there are valuable things in this essay, a defense of noncognitivism as traditionally defined isn't one of them.

The next five essays address broadly political topics. "Bloom and Nietzsche" attacks Allan Bloom's The Closing of the American Mind. I don't know how many followers Bloom has today, but I hope there aren't many. His account of the history of philosophy as a series of grand deceptive schemes to protect the community of truth-seekers seems better for entertaining drunk colleagues at a party than for publication. If Clark's work reduced his influence, I thank her.

I wasn't excited to read "Nietzsche's Misogyny" because Nietzsche's misogyny depresses me. But I appreciated Clark's sensible and interesting points about a variety of issues throughout, from Freud to immoralism to honesty. The core of the essay is a series of arguments for understanding Nietzsche in Beyond Good and Evil as having the self-awareness to tell us that some of his misogynistic remarks are merely driven by his bruised feelings and recognizing that these don't represent the truth about women. On Clark's interpretation, Nietzsche is showing us what the intellectual virtue of honestly pursuing the truth looks like. The extended arguments against Julian Young in the part of the introduction discussing this essay should also be read by anyone who has the fortitude to explore this issue.

"On Queering Nietzsche" engages with the work of two scholars who have a broadly postmodern reading of Nietzsche. The essay was initially given as a lecture at the Society for Gay and Lesbian Philosophy in response to two other presentations at that meeting and addresses a wide variety of topics raised by her interlocutors. Clark's concise but thoughtful clarifications of what makes someone count as gay were helpful in responding to Kevin Hill's suggestion that Nietzsche was a closeted homosexual. Also impressive was her engagement with Tamsin Lorraine's work, which comes from a radically different philosophical tradition than hers and mine. Responding to postmodern readings of Nietzsche has been a focus of Clark's most celebrated work, and it was exciting to see her do this in a context that will be new to many of her readers. It's good that the book provides a venue for this excellent essay to appear. As a series of responses, it would've otherwise been hard to publish, and the many good ideas in it might've been lost.

"Nietzsche's Antidemocratic Rhetoric" argues that Beyond Good and Evil doesn't express a commitment to aristocratic or otherwise undemocratic political views, engaging in depth with Lawrence Hatab's Nietzschean defense of democracy. Clark sees Nietzsche as committed to a broadly aristocratic value system, but not necessarily to aristocratic political institutions. I thought this was at least a correct account of what Nietzsche cared most about. As she points out, many of Nietzsche's remarks about domains in which philosophers should rule or in which some sort of slavery is justified don't actually seem to be about ruling a modern state or holding others in the miserable condition we know of from the pre-1865 American South. He does, however, think some people are more valuable than others because they can reach "higher states of soul" (182) and is concerned that democratic tendencies might prevent us from making these evaluations. If Hatab and the other philosophers Clark discusses haven't done so yet, I hope they take this excellent essay as an occasion to respond.

"The Good of Community", co-authored with Monique Wonderly, criticizes Julian Young's view that Nietzsche regards the flourishing of communities as the most valuable thing. This is a departure from standard interpretations on which Nietzsche values community flourishing simply as a means to individual flourishing. Clark and Wonderly suggest a middle path: Nietzsche values some structures that can be realized by the way people are organized in communities or the way psychological components are organized in people. This framework provides plausible and interesting readings of many passages. They note the similarity to Plato's analogy between the just city and the just person's soul.

The metaphysical section begins "Deconstructing The Birth of Tragedy", the oldest essay in the collection. Clark describes a significant problem that Nietzsche himself may have recognized later: while Dionysus is both the god of the affirmation of life and the provider of access to the truth, the truth he delivers is that life is too terrible to be affirmed by anyone who knows its nature. This could make a Dionysian perspective incoherent. While an essay written today wouldn't need to engage so much with Paul de Man, Clark's positive contributions should be considered by anyone interested in The Birth of Tragedy.

The next essay explores one of the deepest internal tensions in Nietzsche's philosophy: his attraction both to empiricism and to Schopenhauer's metaphysics of the will. Clark presents an impressive argument that he "became an empiricist precisely as a follower of Schopenhauer and that he remained one to the end" (215). Clark describes Schopenhauer's attraction to Hume with informative historical detail. While the philosophical tension between empiricism and Schopenhauerian metaphysics remains hard to resolve, we now have an impressively unified historical account of now Nietzsche came to be torn between them. The essay made me wonder how much of Nietzsche's enthusiasm for Schopenhauer might actually be for borrowings from Hume. The discussion of value in this essay is especially worthwhile, with Clark reading Nietzsche's view as broadly Humean. Many similar problems arise in pinning down Hume and Nietzsche's metaethical views, so there are advantages in not trying to be much more precise.

The concise and useful "Nietzsche as Anti-metaphysician" traces the development of Nietzsche's metaphysical views. Clark sees him as moving from the "artist's metaphysics" of The Birth of Tragedy to the empiricism of Human, all-too-Human and Daybreak. She discusses the difficulty of characterizing the metaphysical views in subsequent works. Nietzsche provides linguistic and psychological explanations of how philosophers make mistakes in accepting nonreductive metaphysical views while also criticizing crude naturalistic reductions. Clark's presentation is accurate as far as it goes. It would be great if we could say something more unified and precise about later works, though Nietzsche's views are disunified enough that maybe we can't.

Last is Clark and Dudrick's "Nietzsche's Philosophical Psychology: Will to Power as Theory of the Soul", which contains excerpts from their 2012 book. They boldly defend a homuncular account of drives. I interpreted naturalist objections to the homuncular model differently than they did. If drives are like people, they'll have some essential properties of persons that non-persons lack -- perhaps their own qualia. But we have no empirical evidence that drives have these properties -- certainly there's no evidence that my hunger and thirst have their own qualia, separate from the qualia they cause me to have. Homuncular views either ascribe personlike properties to drives in an empirically indefensible way or say nothing distinctive. Perhaps I don't understand what the commitments of the homuncular model are. If you do, you'll probably get a lot out of this essay, which includes an extended discussion of Plato's view of the soul.

Nietzsche scholarship has been advancing quickly, so it's inevitable that recent work will surpass some older material in a volume like this one. Much of the best recent scholarship critically examines Clark's views, finding ways to avoid their shortcomings while retaining their advantages. So the collected essays are sometimes victims of their own positive influence. But even today, much of what Clark built stands even above the rising tide of good scholarship that followed its construction, providing solid support for further work. We should all hope that our own research is so good at withstanding the test of time.