Nietzsche on Freedom and Autonomy

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Ken Gemes and Simon May (eds.), Nietzsche on Freedom and Autonomy, Oxford University Press, 2009, 272pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199231560.

Reviewed by Bernard Reginster, Brown University


Nietzsche's views on freedom and autonomy are confined to short, provocative statements dispersed throughout his writings. For this reason, they have not been the object of much focused, systematic scholarly treatment. This collection of essays by some of the finest Nietzsche scholars, edited by Ken Gemes and Simon May (whose helpful introduction also outlines its contents), is a spirited attempt to fill that scholarly gap. The contributions collected in Nietzsche on Freedom and Autonomy can be divided into two groups, each focusing on one basic aspect of the question of freedom and autonomy. The first concerns the nature of the self to which freedom and autonomy are attributed: contributions that concentrate on this question tend to treat freedom as a defining feature of selfhood, or agency. The second question bears on what it is for that self to be, or to achieve, freedom and autonomy: contributions that consider this question tend to treat freedom as an ethical ideal to be pursued by individuals who already are selves or agents. More than half of the contributions (those by Sebastian Gardner, Ken Gemes, Christopher Janaway, Brian Leiter, Aaron Ridley, David Owen, and Maudemarie Clark and David Dudrick) are primarily devoted to the Nietzschean conception of the self, specifically of the self understood as will or agency. And almost all of the remaining contributions (those by Robert Pippin, Simon May, John Richardson, and Peter Poellner) examine Nietzsche's conception(s) of freedom and autonomy as an ethical ideal. I will review each group of essays in turn, and, for ease of presentation, not necessarily in the order in which they appear in the collection.

Gardner's opening essay exposes a fundamental tension in Nietzsche's views of the self. Nietzsche's theoretical approach to the self is eliminativist: the self is a fiction. This theoretical fictionalist view of the self stands in conflict with the conception of the self that seems presupposed by his practical philosophy. Nietzsche's practical philosophy rests on a "view of valuation as reflexive affirmation" (10), by which Gardner means two things:

First, the subject who values must understand himself -- his self -- as the ground of the value that he affirms… . Second, there is a reciprocal relation in Nietzsche between valuing, self-creation, and self-affirmation: to determine such and such to be of value is to determine oneself and to affirm oneself by way of affirming what one values, and vice versa. (9)

This appears to be a version of the Kantian view that the source of (practical) normativity is to be found in the agent: the normative authority of a value for an agent lies in the fact that he "created" it, from which it follows that an agent cannot value anything without also valuing his self as the source of this valuation. And such a reflective self-valuation is not possible without a robust, non-fictionalist conception of the self. Gardner also alludes to another Kantian idea, namely, the primacy of the practical point of view, and points out that Nietzsche's theoretical treatment of the self cannot adequately account for this point of view:

there is in Nietzsche's theoretical treatment of the I no trace of a philosophical account of the self that is in the appropriate way internal, that expresses how the self is for itself. … Nietzsche's theoretical picture of the self by contrast is consistently external, and can be entertained only for as long as the self is viewed from the outside, whence its discrepancy with the (necessarily internal) practical point of view. (11)

This characterization of the issue might suggest that Nietzsche simply failed to recognize that the more implicit commitments of his practical philosophy conflict with his explicit theory of the self. But Gardner and his fellow contributors take pains to show that this is not the case. Gardner himself argues that this fundamental conflict is not so much inconsistency as self-conscious aporia, in which he takes us to be led by strong naturalistic commitments in theory, on the one hand, and the inescapably practical demands of "life" (particularly, the demand for "meaning" discussed in Genealogy III, 28), on the other. Gardner concludes that, for Nietzsche, this aporia points to "the potential independence of the purposes of life from philosophical representations" (29), an idea merely suggested here but explored in later essays, in particular that by Poellner.

Other contributors to this question agree with Gardner's characterization of the fundamental tension in Nietzsche's views, but take him to resolve it, more or less explicitly, in one way or another. Thus, Janaway argues that a practical view of the self must be presupposed in Nietzsche's at least implicit conception of the very knowledge that produces his theoretical (naturalistic) view of the self as a hierarchy of (presumably impersonal) drives. Nietzsche appears committed to holding that knowing must be an activity of the drives, because the self is composed of drives and there is nothing else to do the knowing. However, Janaway maintains, if the self is nothing over and above a hierarchy of drives, then the representations they afford cannot amount to knowledge:

his aims of improving our capacity for knowing and skillfully using our affects demand more of a self than that: he needs his inquirer to be an active and sufficiently unified self that can represent its subject-matter truly, that rides on top of the inner multiplicity, and that can self-consciously adopt attitudes towards it. (60)

Janaway proceeds to suggest that just as Nietzsche cannot coherently wish to get rid of the idea of a unified self, over and above its drives, he cannot wish to get rid of some idea of free agency either, although presumably one that differs from the "neutral subject of free will," which he repudiates (66).

Leiter also acknowledges the tension, but proposes to characterize it as a discrepancy between our experience of willing (as an autonomous cause of action) and what willing really is, namely, a fiction. In his interpretation, Nietzsche maintains that willing exists only in the sense that we can have an experience of willing -- specifically of our decisions causing actions -- but this experience is entirely epiphenomenal. Willing does not cause action, which is in reality the effect of basic psycho-physiological facts about us, which also cause us to have the experience of "willing." Leiter notes that this view anticipates recent findings in neuroscience, which may be put forth as retroactive support for Nietzsche's position.

This approach raises one basic question: what explains the existence of the experience of willing if it is a fiction that plays no causal role in the production of action? Leiter suggests that this experience is a contrivance of the will to power, the desire to feel "superior." In his view, a person has an experience of willing when he identifies with a "commandeering thought," which he takes to govern certain bodily feelings, and this identification produces "the meta-feeling of superiority, which is the feeling of willing proper": "In short, one experiences willing when one feels as if the bodily qualia are obeying the thought, and that the commanding thought is who I am." (110) One problem with this proposal is that it conflates willing with successful willing. But it seems as though I can have an experience of willing even when my body fails to respond, and I precisely do not feel "as if the bodily qualia are obeying the thought." When I will to move my paralyzed body, for example, I have an experience of willing, which means that I identify with a "commandeering thought" even though it does not elicit obedience. But then this identification cannot be motivated by the "feeling of power" that is supposed to explain its occurrence, a fact Nietzsche himself appears to acknowledge (e.g., Daybreak 109).

By way of a close reading of Beyond Good and Evil 19, in which Nietzsche offers one of his most explicit analyses of the will, Clark and Dudrick develop a subtle critique of Leiter's naturalistic interpretation and argue that, naturalistic appearances notwithstanding, Nietzsche in fact advocates a robustly normative conception of the will as an ordering of drives, in which some have the authority to command others. When the normative ordering of a person's drives is reflected in their causal ordering, that is, when the strongest drives are also the drives with the authority to command, or those that express the person's values -- when, in Nietzsche's words, the person's drives constitute a "well-constructed and happy commonwealth" -- then the person's will can be said to cause her actions.

Clark and Dudrick acknowledge that Nietzsche strongly objects to traditional conceptions of the will as the cause of action, but they do not take him to repudiate the notion altogether. He only denies that the will is a sufficient cause of action, but they observe that we customarily speak of something causing something else even when its power to cause depends on the obtaining of certain conditions.

The further conditions to be met if willing is to bring about action are therefore whatever conditions must be in play for the commands of the superior drives to bring about the obedience of the commanded drives. The main condition would presumably be that the commanded drives recognize the authority of the commanding drives, that the commanded and commanding drives thus exist in a 'well-constructed and happy commonwealth'. (262)

In their view, then, Nietzsche only objects to the thought that the will is a sufficient cause of action, which could "affect the causal order of one's drives -- hence what one does -- simply by issuing commands."

Ignoring that fact that willpower only brings about action if the commanded drives are willing to obey, allows one to ignore all of the moral luck -- the influence of 'the world, ancestors, chance, and society' -- that goes into having one's drives exist as a 'well-constructed and happy commonwealth' -- and thus to believe that one has total causal responsibility for one's actions. (263)

Whether or not the will, understood as a faculty framed by the agent's values, can cause action is a matter of luck, but in such lucky circumstances, it has genuine causal power.

Gemes agrees with Leiter that Nietzsche rejects a certain notion of free will, which he calls "deserts free will," which is the free will presupposed by the judgment that someone deserves punishment or reward for an action. But he also points out that Nietzsche endorses a notion of free will (particularly in his discussion of the "sovereign individual"), which he calls "agency free will," because it is a condition of "genuine agency." Crucial to Gemes' account is the idea that genuine agency is not an innate property of individuals, but an achievement, and a fairly unusual one at that:

Nietzsche offers what might be called a naturalist-aestheticist account: to have a genuine self is to have an enduring coordinated hierarchy of drives. Most humans fail to have such a hierarchy: hence they are not sovereign individuals. Rather they are a jumble of drives with no coherent order. Hence, they are not genuine individuals, or, we might say, selves. (46)

Apparently, this account is "naturalistic" in that it denies "the notion of an I separate from the drives" (48). This very denial, however, threatens its coherence. Gemes offers the following "helpful picture":

According to Nietzsche most humans, being merely members of the herd, are merely passive conduits for various disparate forces already existing and operating around them. Some individuals, due perhaps to conscious design but more likely due to fortuitous circumstances, actively collect, order and intensify some of these disparate forces and create a new direction for them, thereby, in fortuitous circumstances, reorienting, to some degree, the whole field of forces in which they all exist. It is these individuals according to Nietzsche who deserve the honorific person, who by imposing their strong will exercise a form of free will and genuine agency. (42)

This picture invites two distinct interpretations. On the one hand, we might take individuals to "exercise a form of free will and genuine agency" when they "actively" order, by "conscious design," the forces at work within themselves. But this suggests that free will and genuine agency are presupposed by such ordering, rather than the product of it, so that there must be "an I separate from the drives." On the other hand, we might take free will and genuine agency to be the product of an ordering of the drives that is "due to fortuitous circumstances." Those individuals in whom "anarchy" reigns, with many drives struggling with each other for the control of their mind and body, would lack free will and genuine agency insofar as they would be unable to govern their lives in accordance with their commitments (as Nietzsche puts it, they would lack "the right to make promises"). Nietzsche calls these individuals "slavish" to reflect the fact that they have no self-control and are enslaved to their variable drives, for which they are "merely passive conduits." We might wonder, however, whether the difference made in the sovereign individual by the fortuitous organization of his drives suffices to account for the emergence in him of "genuine agency." Is the "sovereign" individual so described any less a "merely passive conduit" for forces operating within him (his drives) than the "slavish" individual? Does the fact that the former's drives are organized, while the latter's are not, alter in any way that fundamental passivity? It is therefore unclear how, on this account, Nietzsche would resolve the tension brought out in Gardner's opening essay.

Ridley follows Gemes in taking the freedom associated with the "sovereign individual" to represent a defining condition of agency. The sovereign individual is the individual who has "the right to make promises" (or commitments), and therefore has standing as an agent. In Nietzsche's view, to have the right to make promises, one must be prepared to "stand security" for one's own future. Precisely what this amounts to requires clarification, according to Ridley, for it would be implausible to suppose either that the sovereign individual has complete control over his future circumstances, or that, recognizing the limits of his control, he limits himself to making promises he knows he will be able to keep, other things remaining equal. In Ridley's view, the distinction of the sovereign individual is that he is prepared to see through his commitments, even if other things do not remain equal -- "to indemnify the promise against the ceteris paribus clause altogether, so that the intention is executed regardless." (186) Yet, the issue cannot simply be one of "fidelity to his commitments in seeing them through no matter what", for there will be circumstances in which he cannot see through his commitments in any natural way; the issue is that he will then find an alternative way of seeing them through. Ridley's subtle proposal is that this is possible for promises the characteristic content of which "is an intention whose success-conditions are internal to the execution -- that cannot, that is, be non-trivially specified in advance and independently of some particular way of meeting them." (190) This proposal is not without problems. For one thing, it is not evident why the sovereign individual would confine himself to promises with that characteristic content. For another, even when the content of his promising is an intention whose success conditions are internal to the execution, the sovereign individual might find himself in circumstances in which the promise cannot be indemnified. For instance, I can promise to write you a stirring sonata but find myself unable to do so in any way by a complete lack of musical ability.

Like Ridley, Owen also takes the concept of the "sovereign individual" to articulate Nietzsche's view of full-blooded agency and attributes an "expressive view of agency" to Nietzsche, that is to say, the view that the agent's intentions are not simply revealed, but actually constituted, by the actions that execute them (215). Unlike Ridley, however, he takes the sovereign individual's ability to "stand security" for his future not to be the ability to find some way to fulfill his promise, regardless of circumstances, but rather to consist of "an acknowledgment of one's responsibility as extending to those occasions on which the commitment cannot or must not be honoured in the form of an acknowledgment of the moral remainders that result from one's justified inability to keep one's word." (207)

In contrast to the above-mentioned contributors, May devotes the bulk of his contribution to an exploration of Nietzschean freedom as an ethical ideal. His chief claim has two parts. First, he takes the Nietzschean ideal of freedom to be a kind of experience: to be free is to experience or see oneself in a certain way. Second, to achieve freedom consists essentially in overcoming self-contempt, and this means overcoming the "will to nothingness" that breeds it: "Until man has overcome this self-contempt he has not overcome the legacy of the will to nothingness. As a result he cannot be truly free." (103) Nietzschean freedom, in other words, is self-affirmation. The intuitive plausibility of this view of freedom becomes somewhat muddled, however, when May curiously relates it to the ability to make, and govern oneself in accordance with, commitments (or freedom as a condition of agency). This is perplexing since it makes overcoming self-contempt a condition of the possibility of agency. Self-contempt could no doubt significantly interfere with the making and keeping of commitments, but it is far from clear that it would undermine it altogether.

Richardson also focuses on the character of Nietzschean freedom understood as an ethical ideal that goes beyond the achievement of agency. He begins by conceding that Nietzsche operates with distinct conceptions of freedom. First, he "makes being-a-self and being-free consist in a certain unity or unification of drives" (133): in this case, freedom is a matter of having one's drives harmoniously unified, which results in a state and feeling of absence of constraint, the opposite of which "is the state and feeling of being hemmed and constrained, prevented from venting and discharging" (133). Second, freedom is also "agency" for Nietzsche, which Richardson defines as the capacity to deliberate and make choices, which presumably requires the ability to stand back from, and go against, the drives (137). In Richardson's view, each of these kinds of freedom has a particular history. The first is a legacy of our animal past, whereas the second, "agency," develops in response to the demands of social life. It follows that the standards by the light of which the individual deliberates about his drives are originally social standards: "Agency's principal function (what social processes have mainly designed it for) is to ensure that members do what they must for the society to hang together and prosper." (142) Our conscious and deliberating self secretly expresses interests and values that might be contrary to those of our natural self (the drives). We are thereby induced to reflect on the nature and origin of those interests and values (this is the task of genealogy) and align them with those of our natural self. This points to a new kind of freedom, different from the first two: "So I learn to remake myself in a way never possible before, a self with a new kind of responsibility for itself." (147) Richardson's interpretation is elegant and plausible, even if it says little about the grounds for Nietzsche's optimism about the actual prospects for realizing this new kind of freedom.

Like Richardson, Pippin begins by noting a tension in Nietzsche's conception of freedom. Unlike Richardson, he argues that this tension is not to be resolved into a higher kind of freedom, but is definitive of the very character of freedom. In Nietzsche's view, freedom involves a capacity to sustain a wholehearted commitment to an ideal, on the one hand, and, on the other, a capacity in tension with such a wholehearted commitment, a willingness to overcome or abandon such a commitment in altered circumstances or as a result of some development. To remain stuck to an ideal, to become unable to commit oneself wholeheartedly, or to slide into complacent, lazy identification with what is conventionally valued, are all forms of unfreedom for Nietzsche. In Pippin's view, the issue here

seems to be the proper acknowledgement and endurance of the self-overcoming character of life, … underlying it appears to be a much broader theory about the historical fragility of all human norms, the inevitability not just of a kind of organic growth and death, but of a self-overcoming process … . It is this historical fate for norms that requires the kind of acknowledgment and endurance that Nietzsche praises when he discusses self-overcoming. (80-1)

Pippin recognizes that the achieved state of mind Nietzsche proposes is not easy to make out, but the chief merit of his insightful contribution is to show that this difficulty might be unavoidable, a function of the very character of freedom. He also emphasizes that this state of mind cannot be achieved by a simple exercise of willpower: "The conditions for the attainment of freedom -- the proper relation of attachment and detachment -- seem largely prevoluntary and extend in scope beyond what individuals can do." (83)

Poellner's intriguing exploration of Nietzsche's ideal of freedom of spirit brings together the two main conceptual strands of the collection, namely freedom understood as a condition of the possibility of agency and freedom understood as an ethical ideal. He first notes that agency requires the ability to distinguish between values and "mere" desires. Nietzsche's own view of value, however, threatens to undermine this distinction. Since "our most fundamental acquaintance with values is through affective states," where an affect is "any state with a distinctive phenomenology of favoring or disfavoring, of attraction or 'repulsion'," it is hard to see how to account for the objectivity of the content of value judgment, understood as "the notion of a constraint upon impulses which makes these intelligible to the subject herself and to others as preferences." (158) Poellner proposes to resolve this problem with the idea of phenomenal objectivity:

What is characteristic of the emotions we are inclined to describe as love, admiration, or contempt, is that they are normally experienced not merely as caused by their objects, but as merited by them… . In other words, the affective response is itself experienced as an appropriate response to some feature of the object, as a picking up on some value-aspect pertaining to the object… . Affective experience itself does not commit us to any view about whether or not what is presented in it has the right metaphysical credentials. But, Nietzsche suggests, it does commit us to ascribing at least phenomenal objectivity to those features which it appears to the subject to be a registering of. (162)

It might appear to the agent as if some of her affects are "picking up on some value-aspect pertaining to the object." But should she not worry about the "metaphysical credentials" of this appearance? Poellner suggests that the curbing of the will to truth, which Nietzsche presents as a condition of freedom of spirit, is at bottom the claim that if there is a theoretical conflict between practice and a certain kind of metaphysical truth, we should affirm the former over the latter, provided that we have strong independent reasons to value the practice (173). We have such reasons to value the practice of agency -- of seeing "reason" or "meaning" in life, for example: it is "life-enhancing" for individuals with our constitution, and therefore we could not do without it. The kind of metaphysical truth Nietzsche takes his free spirit to disregard is what Poellner calls a "purely theoretical truth," that is to say, a truth with no practical significance whatsoever. Some theoretical truths are not "purely theoretical" if they have practical significance, for example by underwriting empirical predictions. Even purely theoretical truths can matter practically, however, to an individual who has interests such that his well-being can be affected by knowledge or belief about an empirically inaccessible truth ("autonomously belief-dependent interests"). For instance, the purely theoretical claim "that being is at the fundamental level in principle non-representable" might engender a sense of deep alienation. In Poellner's view, Nietzsche's free spirit would have no such interests, and would therefore be indifferent to purely theoretical truths when they conflict with his practical commitments (177). This is an intriguing proposal, but it is not without problems. For instance, it is far from evident that Nietzsche intends his critique of the will to truth to be limited to "purely theoretical truths": this critique appears to concern the manner in which truth is valued and pursued rather than the kind of truth so valued and pursued. And it is not clear that it is possible, indeed, even desirable, to get rid of all significant "autonomously belief-dependent interests": for instance, is the individual who is in no way affected by the realization that being is fundamentally unknowable really worth emulating?

Mathias Risse's paper is an outlier in this collection, insofar as it does not touch upon the ideas of freedom and autonomy. Its topic is the compatibility of Nietzsche's doctrine of the eternal recurrence with his naturalism. Risse resorts to the somewhat convoluted strategy of beginning by noting the affinity between Nietzsche's naturalism and Freud's and then asking whether Freud would be prepared to affirm the recurrence of his life, on his naturalistic understanding of it. Risse argues that neither Freud nor Nietzsche would be able to do so on two main grounds. First, the naturalistic account of the mind implies that self-knowledge is difficult, if not impossible; and it is hard to see how one could wish for the eternal recurrence of something one cannot know well. Second, the naturalistic account of the mind suggests that certain attitudes presumably incompatible with wishing the eternal recurrence of one's life, such as guilt and ressentiment, are unavoidable. Risse grants that neither the difficulty of self-knowledge, nor the inevitability of ressentiment makes wishing the eternal recurrence impossible, but he finds various proposals to overcome those difficulties inadequate.