Nietzsche on the Decadence and Flourishing of Culture

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Andrew Huddleston, Nietzsche on the Decadence and Flourishing of Culture, Oxford University Press, 2019, 191pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198823674.

Reviewed by Brian Leiter, University of Chicago


This slim, intelligent volume -- an outgrowth of the author's doctoral dissertation -- raises a nice question that has received little attention in recent scholarship: is culture -- meaning "the collective life of a people, understood as akin to a great work of art" (3) -- something that continues to have "intrinsic" or "final" value for Nietzsche, beyond his early work? Andrew Huddleston argues against "individualist" readers of Nietzsche (Alexander Nehamas and this reviewer are targets) who hold that after the early 1870s, he changes his view and "Instead of reposing his hopes in culture . . . comes to occupy himself with the fate of a few great individuals" like Beethoven and Goethe (1). Against this, Huddleston argues that Nietzsche continues "to take culture, as a collective social achievement, to be something of prime importance in its own right" (2), something that is "finally valuable or valuable for [its] own sake" (49), and not simply as a means to something else: "Great cultures . . . are also valuable just in virtue of existing and being the magnificent, vital, admirable expression of life that they are" (49).[1] Huddleston takes the (plausible) view that Nietzsche does not have a "theory of what is valuable for its own sake" (49),[2] but points, appropriately, to section 188 of Beyond Good and Evil where Nietzsche identifies art, music, dance, and reason as among those things "for whose sake it is worthwhile to live on earth" as one bit of evidence that Nietzsche does indeed make such judgments.

The evidence adduced for Huddleston's thesis about the continuing importance of culture for Nietzsche is, alas, underwhelming (a point to which I return), but along the way Huddleston makes many interesting observations that deepen our understanding of the Nietzsche of the early 1870s. In Chapter 1, Huddleston introduces an "existential" conception of culture as one which offers a "worldview . . . to provide people with a form of existential sustenance" (11); in this sense, Christianity and other ascetic religions also constitute a "culture," as Nietzsche emphasizes in the Third Essay of the Genealogy.[3] Huddleston then applies this "functional" conception of culture to the argument in The Birth of Tragedy, where he argues, interestingly, that "Tragic" culture is distinct from Dionysiac culture (18-19). But this merely functional conception is not adequate to the intrinsic significance of "culture" for Nietzsche (27).

In Chapter 2, Huddleston distinguishes the project of Bildung or "self-transformation" (29) -- "a kind of aesthetic self-fashioning" of oneself (30) that also has pedagogical and political aims (such as a "non-vocational idea of what education should be" [30] and the political aim of facilitating everyone's Bildung [31]) -- from Kultur in the "colloquial sense, as the artworks, traditions, customs, and so on of society" and which forms "the backdrop" for Bildung (31). In essays of the early 1870s (especially the essay on David Strauss, and the unpublished On the Future of our Educational Institutions [Bildungsanstalten], Nietzsche argues that "cultivated philistines . . . lack the unity of style that will be characteristic of the person with genuine Bildung" (37), this unity "remain[ing] one of Nietzsche's salient marks of great individuals" (38).

But where is the evidence that cultures, understood now as "the form of life of a people, looked upon as if it were a form of art," are "valuable, not just for the ways they can enhance individuals, but as ends in themselves" (44)? In Chapter 3, Huddleston points to the influence of the Romantic ideal of Poesie on Nietzsche's work of the early 1870s. The aim of Poesie was "to break down the barriers between art and life, so that the entire world becomes a work of art" (50, quoting Frederick Beiser). But the key question, as Huddleston notes (52), is whether this Romantic ideal carried over to Nietzsche's mature works. Huddleston adduces evidence (mainly from two works of 1888, The Antichrist and Twilight of the Idols) that Nietzsche continued to admire and praise whole cultures of the past, such as that of the Roman Empire (52-54),[4] but also acknowledges that "it may well be that a culture like of the Roman Empire is no longer possible" because "society is simply too fragmented for anything like that to occur" (54). Huddleston admits that:

Nietzsche does appear to give up hope for this sort of integrated society, united by a shared form of life, and realizing a magnificent collectivist culture. To that extent, the [individualist] readings that see him as moving away from culture in his later work are on to something important . . . [since] when it comes to more recent cultures . . . Nietzsche emphasizes the role of a few great individuals as the isolated pillars of the culture. (55)

This is an admirable concession that, in fact, the individualist readings are correct, that "Instead of reposing his hopes in culture . . . [Nietzsche] comes to occupy himself with the fate of a few great individuals" (1), as Huddleston put it at the start.

In the remaining chapters, Huddleston explores a variety of themes loosely related to "culture" in Nietzsche's work. In Chapter 4, he takes issue with the view I have defended (2002; 2015), that "Cultural toxins (particularly those of Christianity and its morality) threaten the potentially great individuals" (61).[5] Much of the chapter makes points that no one disputes: for example, that Christianity and the "slave revolt" in morals had positive effects in making human beings "interesting" (61-62; cf. Leiter 2002: 205-206), that Beethoven (and other geniuses Nietzsche admires) drew on the Christian traditions in their art (64), and that "some of the salient characteristics of great individuals depend on their relationship to their cultural surroundings" (70). Huddleston concedes that, "Had Beethoven [taken morality seriously and] spent his life ministering to the needs of the poor, or consumed with self-pity for his deafness, he would not have been able to produce the great works that he did" (63), but argues that the historical evidence refutes the thesis that morality poses a threat to the flourishing of great individuals:

Before there was Nietzsche, and his critique of morality, there were, by his own lights, great individuals, who managed quite well without him, because they made do ably with what were faced with, whether it be Christianity or some other branch of the morality family. If they did not need his help when these were even stronger cultural forces, why should they need it even more as these cultural forces weakened their social grip in the nineteenth century? (69)

Nietzsche believed that "men of great creativity, the really great men according to my understanding, will be sought in vain today . . . [because] nothing stands more malignantly in the way of their rise and evolution than what in Europe today is called simply 'morality'" (quoted in Leiter 2002: 114, along with many other passages to the same effect), precisely because he thought the present moment was different than the past. Contra Huddleston, Nietzsche does not think the relevant cultural and moral forces were "weaker" at the time he was writing. Huddleston has confused "the Church" and its "poison" as Nietzsche put it in the Genealogy: the nineteenth century was a century of atheism and rejection of religious institutions by the intellectual vanguards, but it was a century that also saw the triumph, from the French Revolution onwards, of precisely the morality Nietzsche opposed. That is the whole point of Nietzsche's famous image of "the Madman" who proclaims the "death of God": no one honestly believes in the supernatural being, yet everyone continues to believe in the morality associated with that deity. "[E]verything goes on as before", as Nietzsche complains in one of his last works, The Antichrist (cf. Leiter 2019b), Huddleston does not recognize that Nietzsche thinks his moment is unique.[6]

Chapter 5 offers a compelling reading of Nietzsche's conception of "décadence" as an attribute of both individuals and cultures. In the case of individuals, décadence is characterized by "com[ing] to crave what is bad for" the individual, which results from "a failure of proper order in the self" (81). For Socrates -- one of Nietzsche's central examples of décadence -- "he is his rational, eternal soul; the body, with its unruly appetites is just a temporary residence. The body and its drives are perceived as a threat," which reason must subjugate (82). But this tyranny of reason is unstable: "the suppressed elements . . . allowed no outlets at all, roil beneath the surface, growing in intensity, like a mob of outcasts . . . ready to riot on the slightest provocation" (86-87). Huddleston offers an elegant argument that the same pattern emerges at the cultural level as well (87-94).

Chapter 6 takes up Nietzsche's claim that every culture productive of human excellence "needs slavery in some sense or other" (97). In published and unpublished work of the 1870s, Nietzsche thought that the best life for the weak and mediocre (the vast majority) was "one of participation in, or in the service of, the cultural sphere, whether it be through promoting the lives of a few great individuals or in aiding the flourishing of the cultural whole" (104; cf. 174-175). Huddleston's discussion of this early theme is, once again, highly illuminating, but evidence that this theme persists into the mature Nietzsche's corpus is limited: Huddleston says that "There is no evidence [in the later work] that Nietzsche's views . . . have changed at all from" the work of the 1870s (122) and points to a passage in The Antichrist (111 n. 36) that seems to endorse the earlier theme. Mostly, later Nietzsche is silent on this topic.

In the preceding chapter, Huddleston sometimes speaks of the "truly good life" (110) for "slaves," as though Nietzsche thought there were such a thing.[7] Chapter 7 considers the meta-ethical question whether "those who are disagreeing with [Nietzsche about evaluative questions] are making a kind of mistake. Are they getting wrong what really is best for them?" (126). He suggests that the "widely divergent readings [of Nietzsche on this topic] may be the result of the fact that his texts seriously underdetermine where he stands on these issues" (128). They "may" also be the result of the fact that the texts underdetermine only what semantics of value to attribute to him (as I argued [Leiter 2002], with which Hussain 2013 concurs, as does Huddleston in part, but only in a footnote at 129 n. 6); on the metaphysics, Nietzsche embraces an anti-realism familiar in philosophy since the Sophists (as everyone from Max Weber to Alasdair MacIntyre has recognized). This chapter's argument is frustrating: Huddleston suggests that anti-realist-sounding passages might admit of a different interpretation in accord with some recent forms of value realism. Huddleston appeals to "reasons of space" for why he does not pursue the arguments or the textual evidence of the anti-realist readings more thoroughly, but given how short this book is, that explanation rings hollow.

The final chapter builds on Chapter 4. Huddleston acknowledges that "it is abundantly clear that Nietzsche thinks of the Christian-moral outlook as having some bad effects" but argues "these effects are not the sole basis for his objection" (156). His dispute is with my thesis (2002, 2015) that Nietzsche objects to morality because it thwarts the flourishing of higher human beings, precisely the ones who "make life worth living" through the outputs of their creative genius. Huddleston aptly describes my view ("the causal model" of critique, he calls it), and also concurs that Nietzsche's target is a motley collection of views and thinkers he amalgamates under "morality." He remarks that "it is difficult to see what united them" (153), but the causal model offers an answer. Huddleston's own answer is more elusive. He offers plentiful textual evidence that the "values ascendant in Christian-moral culture diverge from what by Nietzsche's lights are the right values" (163): "Instead of this world and life, they celebrate a beyond and another life . . . Cowardice in place of bravery. Humility in place of pride. Baseness instead of nobility" (163-164) and so on. Nietzsche ridicules and mocks Christian-moral culture for obvious rhetorical reasons, in order to transform the consciousness of his readers complacent about their morality, as Huddleston finally notes (169). But all this leaves open the question: what's really wrong with these values? I could not determine what Huddleston's alternative answer is supposed to be, apart from an opaque reference to the idea that maybe our current moral attitudes "are presently out of line with what the objects of these attitudes warrant" (170), which would commit Nietzsche to a kind of value realism not argued for.

This book is more a collection of essays -- apart from the first three chapters, which do form a sustained argument -- than a monograph. Readers can profitably dip into the other chapters according to interest; I especially recommend Chapter 5, and also Chapter 6 for the light it sheds on Nietzsche's views in the 1870s. I learned a lot from this volume and I commend it to other Nietzsche scholars, especially those thinking about the role of "culture" in his thought.


Clark, Maudemarie and Monique Wonderly. 2015. "The Good of Community," in J. Young (ed.), Individual and Community in Nietzsche's Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).

Huddleston, Andrew. 2017. "Normativity and the Will to Power: Challenges for a Nietzschean Constitutivism," Journal of Nietzsche Studies 47: 436-456.

Hussain, Nadeem. 2011. "The Role of Life in the Genealogy," in S. May (ed.)., Nietzsche's On the Genealogy of Morality (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).

-- . 2013. "Nietzsche's Metaethical Stance," in K. Gemes & J. Richardson (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Nietzsche (Oxford: Oxford University press).

Katsafanas, Paul. 2013. Agency and the Foundations of Ethics: Nietzschean Constitutivism (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Leiter, Brian. 2002. Nietzsche on Morality (London: Routledge).

-- . 2015. Nietzsche on Morality, 2nd edition (London: Routledge).

-- . 2019a. Moral Psychology with Nietzsche (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

-- . 2019b. "The Death of God and the Death of Morality," The Monist 102: 386-402.

Young, Julian. 2006. Nietzsche's Philosophy of Religion (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).

[1] Huddleston, sensibly, rejects the much stronger and implausible claim defended by Julian Young (2006) according to which the community, not the individual, is Nietzsche's primary concern. Clark and Wonderly (2015) offer decisive objections to Young's reading; for Huddleston's own doubts, see pp. 25-26.

[2] I am inclined to agree, although scholars have proposed criteria like "life" (which Huddleston alludes to in passing) and "power" (which he does not discuss). On the former, see, e.g., Hussain (2011) and the latter Katsafanas (2013). For doubts, see Huddleston (2017) and Leiter (2019: 59 n. 19).

[3] Why do people need "existential sustenance"? "Omnipresent" suffering was Schopenhauer's answer (12), but Huddleston suggests that Nietzsche is concerned with the problem of "meaning" simpliciter, such as "the meaningless that afflicts modern life" (14).  This is much less clear. Nietzsche breaks clearly with Schopenhauer in emphasizing that the issue is the meaninglessness of suffering, and not suffering per se. Huddleston points to the "infamous 'Last Man' from Thus Spoke Zarathustra" as someone free of "existential despair" who still suffers from the problem of "meaningless," but I do not see the evidence that Nietzsche thought the problem with the "last men" is that they lack meaning, but rather that their mode of existence is incompatible with human excellence. As Nietzsche himself argued in the Genealogy (3rd Essay, section 19), there are many "innocent" ways of anesthetizing pain, many of which the "last men" employ.

[4]Huddleston's strongest piece of textual evidence is Nietzsche's passing reference in Twilight of the Idols in his polemic against the Germans that "in what matters most -- and that always remains culture -- the Germans are no longer worthy of consideration" (55). Unfortunately for Huddleston, this brief aside is atypical.

[5] Nietzsche's target, as I argue, is broader than Christianity and its morality (Leiter 2002:   78-81).

[6] Huddleston later admits that the Kantian/Christian "conception of human dignity continues to exert a powerful influence on the modern moral imagination" (107) without realizing how it undermines the argument in Chapter 4. Huddleston also notes (66-68) that Nietzsche thought he himself was able to overcome pernicious and "decadent" influences. Huddleston greatly overreaches any textual evidence, however, in claiming that Nietzsche believes that as a general principle, "If morality is successful at stifling a person, then ipso facto he is not great" (69).

[7] Other times, he speaks of "the better Nietzschean life" available to them (103), which is I think more apt, since it does not presuppose there is an objective fact of the matter.