Nietzsche, Psychology, and First Philosophy

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Robert Pippin, Nietzsche, Psychology, and First Philosophy, U of Chicago Press, 2010, 139pp., $29.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226669755.

Reviewed by Neil Sinhababu, National University of Singapore


Robert Pippin's goal in Nietzsche, Psychology, and First Philosophy is

to present a comprehensive interpretation of what Nietzsche means by 'psychology,' what the relationship is, as he understands it, between such a psychology and traditional philosophy, and why he thinks such a psychology is (indeed is, as he says, 'now') so important, why it is 'the path to the fundamental problems' (xi-xii).

One might expect to find an account of this psychology in the first chapter, titled "Psychology as the 'Queen of the Sciences.'" Here Pippin characterizes Nietzsche's psychology as standing outside the tradition of philosophical psychology from Plato to Hume to Davidson, with philosophers defending positions on such issues as the roles of reason and passion in directing action:

Nietzsche does not appear to want simply to add another position to this list. Indeed, his main point seems to be that there is no general philosophical psychology. His view, which I will be exploring in these chapters, is that views of the soul and its capacities vary with beliefs about and commitments to norms; normative commitments are subject to radical historical change; and so what counts as soul or psyche or mind and thus psychology also changes. The "soul" is merely the name for a collective historical achievement, a mode of self-understanding, of one sort or another, what we have made ourselves into at one point or another in the service of some ideal or other. When we describe to one another what the soul is, we mean thereby to propose an ideal, usually something like psychic health. Hence also the deep interconnection or inseparability between psychology and genealogy (3).

The view seems to be that psychological claims are in some way grounded in normative claims. Here we might ask Pippin how exactly normative commitments are connected to psychological claims, how historical changes play into this relationship, and how the resulting psychology will explain our thoughts, feelings, and actions. (If Pippin leaves us with a psychology that cannot accomplish this explanatory task, we might ask what makes it psychology at all.) Given satisfactory answers to these questions, we might ask for textual evidence that Nietzsche held such a view and for independent reasons to accept it.

Unfortunately, Pippin's scattered remarks developing this view do not add up to any clear picture of how the normative and the psychological are supposed to relate. He gives us little reason to think Nietzsche held a view along the lines described above or to think such a view is independently plausible. While the book's meandering from topic to topic leaves its argumentative structure unclear, it seems that Pippin wants to assemble a set of Nietzschean insights that cannot be accommodated within traditional philosophical psychology, motivating the idea that Nietzsche's psychological views must involve a radical departure from the tradition. But many of the things he points to as evidence fall within traditional philosophical psychology, and sometimes only a strained reading of the text has Nietzsche endorsing extraordinary psychological claims.

Pippin characterizes Nietzsche as following the French moralists: Pascal, La Rochefoucauld, and especially Montaigne. Nietzsche certainly was interested in these figures, but Pippin leaves it unclear how they take us beyond traditional philosophical psychology or suggest that we should ground psychological claims in normative claims. (La Rochefoucauld often reveals putatively moral behavior to be a banal activity tractable within even the most flatfooted psychological theories -- the pursuit of self-interest.) Pippin writes that Nietzsche's interest in these figures is in their "'stance towards life,' an orientation such that things in a life matter or they don't" (12). For example, Nietzsche is interested in how Montaigne maintained "such a thoroughgoing skepticism and clarity about human frailty and failings without Pascal's despair and eventual surrender or La Rochefoucauld's icy contempt for the 'human all too human'", and how he became "a thoughtful, ferociously honest, cheerful free spirit, someone who had succeeded at the task of 'making [himself] at home in the world'" (10-11).

This seems right. But why it forces us to reject traditional philosophical psychology is unclear. Why couldn't we build a philosophical psychology that would allow us to describe and understand the mental states involved in Montaigne's stance towards life? This question comes up repeatedly in Chapter 2, when Pippin spends much time discussing the "primordiality" of psychology for Nietzsche. He defines this as the question of how we can project value onto things without actively deciding to do so (29). While this is certainly an issue that interests Nietzsche, it is an ordinary question for traditional moral psychology, addressed by philosophers from David Hume to Simon Blackburn, as well as recent empirical psychologists. The question of how it is that we can form "depth commitments" that bind us to important life projects, discussed at length by Pippin, is similarly tractable (27). The relation between psychology and the normative here merely concerns what psychological states are involved when we judge things to have value or commit ourselves. This is part of the subject matter of traditional moral psychology. Pippin seems to have conflated his thesis, that psychology is grounded in the normative judgments of a time, with the obvious fact that normative judgments (which change over time) are realized by particular psychological states.

Pippin's third chapter, "Modernity as a Psychological Problem," discusses the condition of society after the death of God. He characterizes the nihilism that Nietzsche is concerned with as a "failure of desire, the flickering out of some erotic flame" (54). Pippin is right to focus on the affective component of nihilism, which seems to be what concerns Nietzsche about it. Much of the rest of the chapter hints at the view of psychology that will be laid out in the subsequent chapters.

Early on, Pippin identifies an interpretation he disagrees with: a naturalist position on which

when trying to account for the human capacities required when persons direct their actions on the basis of norms, we should appeal to capacities also discovered in nonmoral or nonethical contexts, and those capacities must be consistent with our being organic material bodies located in space and time (3).

The major engagement with the naturalist comes in chapter 4, where Pippin discusses Nietzsche's famous image of the lightning and its flash:

And just as the common people separate lightning from its flash, and take the latter to be a deed, something performed by a subject, which is called lightning, popular morality separates strength from the manifestation of strength, as though there were an indifferent substratum behind the strong person which had the freedom to manifest strength or not. But there is no 'being' behind the deed, its effect and what becomes of it; 'the doer' is invented as an afterthought, -- the deed is everything. (Pippin 71-72, citing the Diethe translation of Genealogy I:13)

Pippin rejects naturalistic readings of Nietzsche which view this passage merely as denying some variety of free will. These readings draw support from the mention of freedom in the quoted passage and the context as well as the discussion of how the weak use this view to hold the strong responsible for their actions. According to Pippin, "Nietzsche does not seem interested in merely naturalizing all talk of motives, goals, intentions, and aversions; he denies that whole model of behavior, 'root and branch.'" (74). Pippin argues that this passage from the Genealogy is incompatible with naturalism, because naturalistic pictures of the mind involve "some determinate causal factor 'behind' and 'before' the deed" (74). He solves this problem by making the doer "not separate, distinctive from the activity itself; it is in the deed" (75). He admits that "philosophically, a great deal more needs to be said before this understanding of 'the doer in the deed' could be defended," (79) and lists several difficulties with it, for example "If whatever it is that is expressed in such deeds is not a stable core or substantial self … what could form the basis of the temporal story that would link these manifestations and transformations?" (84).

It is unclear why naturalists (as Pippin defines their view) are barred from simply mimicking Pippin's move and conceiving of the doer-deed relation as a part-whole relation rather than a causal relation. They probably would not want to do this, just because it would leave them with all the difficulties Pippin's own view faces, but at any rate there is no special problem for naturalism here. The problem is for views that use mental states in causal explanations, which cross-cuts the naturalist/non-naturalist distinction. What Pippin really wants to do here is independent of the naturalism debate. He wants to use the strangeness of making doers part of deeds to fuel his general argument that Nietzsche rejects traditional philosophical psychology. To do this, he needs a much better argument against the free will interpretation discussed above, which will otherwise displace his own. Later in the section, Nietzsche talks about how the weak person "needs the belief in a neutral 'subject' with free choice," suggesting that the rejection of "the doer" is only a rejection of a subject with free will. Even setting charity aside, fidelity to the text supports the free will reading far better than Pippin's interpretation that Nietzsche is rejecting the whole model of behavior that posits real motives, goals, intentions, and aversions.

Pippin's arguments against naturalistic interpretations usually do not cite naturalistic interpreters. (I assume that he has Brian Leiter in mind, but Leiter is never mentioned.) This is a strange way to conduct an interpretive dispute. To criticize an interpretation one disagrees with, one should cite something incorrect an interpreter said and present textual evidence that demonstrates its falsity. Instead, Pippin fails to defeat the nameless naturalist he defines.

After spending many pages of chapter 5 laying out a model of the mind that makes self-deception an interesting phenomenon, Pippin announces that "Nietzsche is rejecting this whole model: the account of mindedness, self-knowledge, and action-explanation that it involves. Everything, that is, depends on the proper attention to the way he treats the subject-deed relation" laid out previously (100). Instead,

self-knowledge is not observational but interpretive and, let us say, always promissory, futural, as complexly interpretive as the interpretive question of just what it is that is being done; action-explanation is not causal, and motives cannot be understood as fixed, datable mental items. Rather, self-ascribing a motive is more like provisionally trying out an interpretation (101).

This is probably the clearest and most direct statement of the psychological view that Pippin attributes to Nietzsche.

Readers impressed by Nietzsche's psychological observations may be intrigued by an interpretation that presents psychology as "first philosophy," and read Pippin's book for this reason. Perhaps they admire passages such as Daybreak 109, where reasoning about how to combat a vehement drive is revealed to be produced by an even stronger drive controlling the intellect. Such readers will be surprised at how Pippin's interpretation robs these explanations of their value by denying the fixed and real existence of the desires and drives which they involve. Nietzsche's psychological explanations -- or any others that we regard as the hard truth of the matter -- lose the advantage that correct psychological explanations have over fanciful self-explanations that smug people might use to feel good about themselves. Pippin seems to embrace this consequence of his view:

On such a picture, it is not so paradoxical to suggest that the content of some avowal and the right act description are so pregnant with plausible possibilities that the prospect of self-serving or self-aggrandizing interpretations might not look so counterintuitive (101).

The first philosophy of Pippin's interpretation is not psychology, but the impossibility of doing real psychology.

The final chapter discusses freedom. According to Pippin, the only kinds of freedom Nietzsche cares about are "self-overcoming" (106) which he seems to sometimes call "self-mastery" (109). He rejects an interpretation on which self-mastery is achieved if one "'gives style' to one's character" (109). (This sounds like Alexander Nehamas' view, but Pippin does not cite him by name. Similarly, an actual psychological experiment he describes in chapter 5 (93-94) is not cited.) His clearest account of Nietzsche's view of freedom runs as follows:

achieved freedom involves achieving a capacity both to sustain a wholehearted commitment to an ideal (an ideal that is worth sacrificing for, that provides the basis for a certain hierarchical unity among one's interests and passions) and what appears at first glance to be a capacity in some tension with such wholeheartedness -- a willingness to overcome or abandon such a commitment in altered circumstances or as a result of some development. (112-113)

Setting aside the issue of whether Nietzsche had this account of freedom, one wonders how Pippin can talk about a hierarchical unity among one's passions after objecting to the sort of psychology that explains things by positing real passions. (It is hard to see how the view from his third chapter that nihilism involves a failure of erotic attachments will avoid the same problem.) If Pippin had presented a detailed picture of how normative commitments during various historical periods genuinely license some psychological claims but not others, perhaps he would be able to give useful psychological explanations. But the only such picture that has been offered allows people to interpret themselves however they please, leaving his psychological stories no better or worse than anything else. So he backs off, saying "nothing really counts in some probative way as 'the' establishment of mastery" (118). Rejecting any general philosophical psychology can be fun, until you want to discuss how people think and feel, and then there is nothing useful you can say.