Nietzsche's Critiques: The Kantian Foundations of his Thought

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Hill, R. Kevin, Nietzsche's Critiques: The Kantian Foundations of his Thought, Oxford University Press, 2003, 242pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199255830.

Reviewed by Maudemarie Clark, Colgate University and David Dudrick, Colgate University


In 1866, as his early philosophical views were just beginning to take shape, Nietzsche wrote to a friend: "Kant, Schopenhauer, and this book of Lange's--I don't need anything else." Much has been written about Nietzsche's relation to the two minor philosophers in this group, but very little about his relation to the one great one. Although some commentators consider Nietzsche sufficiently influenced by Kant to count him a neo-Kantian, the English literature on Nietzsche contains little information about what Nietzsche actually read of Kant's, much less a detailed study of Nietzsche's debt to Kant. Kevin Hill's book is a noteworthy attempt to fill in this gap in Nietzsche scholarship. Hill effectively counters the common view that Nietzsche neither read much Kant nor understood him very well, and that he arrived at his view of Kant largely through the distorting lens of Schopenhauer's philosophy.

According to Hill, Nietzsche's view of Kant is similar to Hegel's: "Kant is the philosopher with whom one must come to terms. One must either become a Kantian, or, starting from a Kantian foundation, think one's way out of Kantianism" (6). Nietzsche was not simply influenced by Kantian themes, perhaps largely through Schopenhauer and the neo-Kantians; Hill's main thesis is that Nietzsche was "Kantian with a capital 'K,'" that he engaged in a careful reading of each of Kant's three Critiques, and that he developed his most characteristic philosophical doctrines in response to them. Hill claims that Nietzsche derived the metaphysics of The Birth of Tragedy from the third Critique, the metaphysics and epistemology of his middle and late work from the first Critique, and the three treatises of On the Genealogy of Morality from the second.

Now, Hill admits that much of his case is speculative. He says that he will make it by showing "how one can arrive at distinctively Nietzschean positions by making plausible, intelligible moves in response to Kantian problems" (8). But showing this would surely be insufficient to establish his thesis Ð the fact that Nietzsche's thought can be understood as taking place within a Kantian framework does not imply that it did in fact take place in that framework or that it is best understood in its terms. And herein lies a significant problem with the book: Hill works to establish the first of these claims, but does little to make plausible either of the other two.

Our review will concentrate on the part one of this two-part book, which argues for the strikingly original thesis that the metaphysics, epistemology, and aesthetics of The Birth of Tragedy (BT) "can only be made sense of within the context of Nietzsche's appropriation of Kant's third Critique"(35). Although it has long been known that Nietzsche read parts of the Critique of Judgment (CJ) in 1867, it has not been claimed previously that this reading exerted much influence on his philosophical development, much less that the influence shows up in BT. It is usually assumed that Nietzsche derived BT's metaphysics from Schopenhauer's. Why does Hill think otherwise, especially given his view that Nietzsche accepted Schopenhauer's metaphysics when he first encountered it in 1865 and that he seems to accept it in BT? We can break his reasons down into five claims. First, in notes written four years before BT, Nietzsche rejected Schopenhauer's metaphysics of the will, denying that we can have any knowledge of the thing in itself, and the same denial appears in "Truth and Lie," written the year after BT. Second, if we look closely at BT, we can see that "Nietzsche's views on the thing-in-itself and our knowledge of it as well as his account of the plastic arts are simply not Schopenhauerian" (80). Third, between 1865, when he was a Schopenhauerian, and 1868, when he was not, Nietzsche's reading focused on Kant's third Critique, Kuno Fischer's two-volume work on Kant, and Lange's neo-Kantian History of Materialism. Fourth, the metaphysics and aesthetics of BT "can be derived from the metaphysics of the Critique of Judgment" (104). Fifth, there is no other plausible way to understand their derivation. There is much that is of interest in Hill's attempt to establish these claims, but his case is ultimately unpersuasive. The first three claims are largely correct, but fail to establish his thesis; the fourth and fifth would do so, but are highly questionable.

To begin with, the first two claims are not as original as Hill seems to think. For instance, in papers published in 1998, both Christopher Janaway and Maudemarie Clark argue for the first and for a less overstated version of the second.[1] They recognize that by 1868 Nietzsche had formulated fatal objections to Schopenhauer's metaphysics and argue that BT can be understood without supposing that Nietzsche backtracked from these arguments. It is unfortunate that Hill does not take account of their papers. It means that he argues for the fourth and fifth claims above without taking into account plausible alternatives to his story of how Nietzsche arrived at BT's metaphysics. As Nietzsche later described this "artists' metaphysic," it sees the world as the "vision" and "attained salvation" of an "artist-god", who in creating it "frees himself from the distress of fullness and overfullness and from the affliction of the contradictions compressed in his soul." It is difficult to see anything Kantian about this. Hill denies that it is Schopenhauerian on the grounds that Schopenhauer's thing in itself is blind striving will whereas Nietzsche's world creator "must also be understood on the model of a perceiver" (104). He thinks this points to Kant: "This is just how Kant characterizes the supersensible: as an 'intuitive understanding'" (104). Here Hill ignores the obvious fact that Kant's intuitive intellect cannot be a perceiver in the sense that Nietzsche's artist-god is. The latter creates the world of empirical objects in time and space as a spectacle, a sensible vision, for itself. The former is intellectual, not perceptual, and time and space, which are forms of sensibility, can have nothing to do with it. Further, no one claims that Nietzsche's artist-god is exactly Schopenhauer's will, but only that Nietzsche arrived at his conception of it by transforming that will so that it is capable of achieving salvation in the same way in which, according to Schopenhauer, human beings attain temporary salvation in aesthetic experience, namely, by freeing themselves from the pressures of their will through pure (will-less) contemplation. Nietzsche thus transformed Schopenhauer's metaphysics to avoid the pessimistic conclusion Schopenhauer drew from it, the claim that true salvation is found only in denial of the will, in turning away form life. And, as Clark argues, by linking the will to a subject capable of perception, Nietzsche also patches up one of the holes he found in Schopenhauer's metaphysics in his 1868 notes, namely, that the subject and therefore the world of appearances comes into existence only to serve the will of individuals, whereas these individuals exist only for the subject. That BT's artist-god is a transformation of Schopenhauer's will along these lines, one meant to address two major difficulties Nietzsche had with it--its asceticism and its incoherence--seems much more plausible than that it has much to do with Kant's intuitive understanding.

Hill's more important claim about the Kantian connection is that the third Critique's concept of reflective judgment gives us "the only way we can make sense of Nietzsche's extravagant claims" about an artist-god, given his denial, in notes both before and after BT, that we can know anything about the nature of the thing in itself that lies beyond the empirical realm. (For an alternative way of making sense of this, see Clark 1998.) Hill's account of reflective judgments in a full chapter devoted to the third Critique is clear and helpful, as is the whole chapter. Indeed, this is the most rewarding section of the book. The alleged connection to BT is that reflective judgments contain a reference to objects without making assertions about them. For Kant, the judgment that lungs are for absorbing oxygen cannot be about lungs "in any straightforward sense" (60). If it were, he would have to read it as making a claim about divine intentions, which would "render the claim's truth-value unknowable" and deny functional judgments a place in science (63). Kant saves functional judgments for biology and medicine by reading them instead as "assertions about our thoughts." The form of a functional judgment is something like this: "'I can't help but think that lungs are for absorbing oxygen [i.e., designed to absorb oxygen], given the way minds have to work if they are to experience at all'" (62). Hill's account here is exemplary in its clarity.

Problems arise when Hill imposes this structure on BT. He thinks that BT's talk about an artist-god has the same "I-can't-help-but-think" structure: "Birth of Tragedy presents reflective judgments concerning how we must think about noumena if we are to make sense of our experience of designedness in nature" (103). The textual evidence for this claim from BT is a single first-person sentence in which Nietzsche says that the more he recognizes the power of artistic impulses in nature and the longing in them for "redemption through illusion" [Schein], the more he feels "impelled to the metaphysical assumption that the truly existent primal unity, eternally suffering and contradictory, also needs the rapturous vision, the pleasurable illusion, for its continuous redemption" (BT 4). This is a very slim basis on which to hang the interpretation. Nothing in this passage suggests that Nietzsche is concerned with either design or transcendental necessity, and Hill does nothing to help us see that he is. He does offer substantial evidence from Nietzsche's notebooks that he was thinking seriously about teleological judgment several years before BT. It seems plausible, as Hill claims, that Lange convinced Nietzsche of Darwin's importance, which led him to see problems regarding teleology in Schopenhauer's metaphysics, and that he turned to Kant's third Critique in search of a way to reconcile teleology with science. But the notes Hill analyzes at length provide no substantial evidence that Nietzsche took over Kant's theory of teleological judgments or that he thought anything like it was necessary "to reconcile functional description with Darwinism" (83). Hill is ultimately reduced to arguing that Nietzsche's views changed in ways we would expect "if [he] had adopted something like Kant's theory of teleological judgment" (94). He says we would expect him to prohibit "determinative judgments about noumena, such as those made by Schopenhauer," and "to speak reflectively of a design-producing understanding in the supersensible realm, as Kant had" (94). Nietzsche did change his view in the first way, but any number of factors could account for that, and Hill offers no compelling evidence that it did change in the second way. He seems to be looking at Nietzsche's texts through a lens that allows him to see only features that remind him of Kant, however forced an interpretation that requires.

This is even clearer when it comes to BT's aesthetics. How else can one explain that Hill never mentions music, out of which BT claims tragedy was born, or Wagner, whose relation to Nietzsche surely explains more about BT than his reading of Kant? Nietzsche's overriding concern in BT is redemption, a good Wagnerian theme, and Schopenhauer gave him the model for how art could achieve it. Hill doesn't seem to recognize this, focusing instead on what he takes to be Nietzsche's concern with "vindicating the intersubjective validity of aesthetic judgment" (107) along Kantian lines. He also claims that "the Nietzschean tragic is, to all intents and purposes, a variation on Kant's dynamical sublime" (112). It does seem likely, as Hill argues, that Nietzsche's reading of Kant on the sublime led him to the idea of "the sublime as the artistic taming of the horrible" (BT 7). But taking this idea as far as Hill does results in a quite non-Nietzschean account of tragedy, according to which tragic affect is due to the "invigorating awareness of our own capacity to give form to our own characters" to which tragedy allegedly leads (112). There is much that is ingenious in Hill's attempt to derive Nietzsche's account of tragedy from Kant, but at best it offers an Apollonian account of tragedy. Nietzsche makes clear that tragic affect, "the metaphysical joy in the tragic," is Dionysian. It comes not from an awareness of the individual self and its power, but from an identification with the overwhelming eternally creative and destructive force that overcomes all individuals. The Dionysian is evidently hard to see though a Kantian lens.

Hill's book is to be recommended for its clear expositions of the Critiques, for the information it provides concerning Nietzsche's actual reading of Kant, and for its provocative interpretation of Nietzsche's debt to Kant. While that interpretation is ultimately unconvincing, it does much to open the way to new hypotheses concerning Nietzsche's Kantianism (or, more plausibly, his "kantianism").

[1] Janaway, C. "Schopenhauer as Nietzsche's Educator"; Clark, M., "On Knowledge, Truth and Value: Nietzsche's Debt to Schopenhauer and the Development of his Empiricism"; both in Janaway, C. (ed.) Willing and Nothingness: Schopenhauer as Nietzsche's Educator. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998