Nietzsche's Ethical Theory: Mind, Self and Responsibility

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Craig Dove, Nietzsche's Ethical Theory: Mind, Self and Responsibility, Continuum, 2008, 162pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826498748.

Reviewed by Paul Katsafanas, University of New Mexico


Craig Dove's book promises to elucidate Nietzsche's ethical theory by drawing on recent work in the philosophy of mind. According to Dove, Nietzsche's work on self-consciousness "lays the foundation for the affirmative ethic he develops" (6). Dove maintains that one achieves Nietzsche's ethical ideal if one is capable of affirming the eternal recurrence of one's life and of loving fate (this is what Nietzsche calls amor fati). The accounts of eternal recurrence and love of fate appeal to claims about the nature of the self, freedom, and responsibility. Those concepts, in turn, are based upon Nietzsche's account of self-consciousness. So the ethical theory turns out to be rooted in an account of self-consciousness.

Dove claims that once we read Nietzsche in this way, "important points of contact" emerge between contemporary philosophy of mind and Nietzsche's work (6). A great deal of the book is devoted to charting these points of contact. Although Dove isn't explicit about this matter, his hypothesis seems to be that recognizing these points of contact helps to illuminate otherwise puzzling aspects of Nietzsche's view. I will return to this point below.

Chapter One introduces the topic and outlines the following chapters. The substantive work begins in Chapter Two, which analyzes Nietzsche's claims about the eternal recurrence. The chapter is chiefly devoted to arguing that Nietzsche's notion of eternal recurrence does not entail determinism. Dove provides a clear summary and interesting analysis of the passages in which Nietzsche discusses eternal recurrence. However, the motivation for this chapter is somewhat unclear. The most promising and influential interpretations of eternal recurrence agree that eternal recurrence should not be interpreted as a metaphysical doctrine about the nature of reality: Nietzsche is not claiming that each event does, in fact, eternally recur. Rather, the eternal recurrence is put forward as a thought experiment, and is designed to test one's reaction to the thought that one's life will endlessly recur. Interpreters have emphasized this point at least since Nehamas (1985). Dove's question of whether eternal recurrence entails determinism would arise only for the largely defunct metaphysical readings, and not for the more widely accepted readings.

Chapter Three analyzes Nietzsche's notion of amor fati (love of fate), and connects this to Nietzsche's understanding of the self. Dove interprets Nietzsche as claiming that the self is in one sense fixed, and in another sense mutable. The self is fixed in that "the individual is the assemblage of components from one's genetic heritage and one's environment" (42). Yet the self is also mutable, in that one can "remake" oneself "through the interpretive lens of language" (42). In other words, I can reinterpret past events, integrating them into a new narrative and thereby giving them a new meaning. Rather than interpreting my failed romance as a permanent blight on my life, for example, I can read it as a preparation for new experiences, and thereby attach a positive value to it. This enables, or perhaps constitutes, amor fati.

Dove takes this point about interpretation to commit Nietzsche to a narrative conception of the self: "Language is essential to this reinterpretation, and thus makes the creation of the individual in Nietzsche's sense possible. The self is thus one's autobiography" (44-45). This narrative conception of selfhood is supposed to be an alternative to the "unified, enduring self as a metaphysical fact -- whether in Platonic, Christian, Cartesian, or Kantian form" (41).

Although Dove discusses this narrative conception of selfhood at length, I think his analysis leaves several important questions unanswered. First, we are not told what a "unified, enduring self as a metaphysical fact" is. One could raise a number of questions about the idea that Kant is committed to a metaphysical claim about the self's unity, to the idea that the Platonic self is unified and enduring (doesn't the Republic famously argue otherwise?), and so on. Second, we are not told why Plato, Christians, Descartes, and Kant cannot admit that we are capable of reinterpreting and thereby changing the meaning of past events in our lives. Why would Kant, for instance, need to deny this point? Third, Dove does not explain why the narrative conception of selfhood is an alternative to these models, rather than simply an additional claim about the self's capacities. Put differently, he does not adequately address the question of why the mere fact that I can reinterpret past events in my life entails a narrative conception of the self. (After all, past events in the world can also be reinterpreted, but this hardly requires viewing the world itself as essentially narrative in structure.) Addressing these questions would have clarified Dove's notion of narrative selfhood.

The idea that Nietzsche embraces a narrative conception of the self originates in Nehamas (1985). Dove devotes part of Chapter Three to a discussion of Nehamas' view, focusing on Nehamas' claim that narrativity serves not only as a descriptive claim about the nature of the self, but also as a normative standard for the self. Dove discusses an interesting criticism here: if everyone's life constitutes a narrative, how can narrativity serve as a normative ideal for us? Wouldn't everyone's life be a success? Dove argues that while everyone's life constitutes some kind of narrative, certain narratives are better than others. The bad narratives do not have "rhyme or reason": they render the agent "the equivalent of a newspaper … with no real effort to shape the pieces into anything suggesting a work as a whole" (49-50). The good narratives "bring together all of [the accidental features of the self] and form them into a whole in which anything can be seen as significant" (51). These claims are suggestive, and it would have been useful for Dove to explore them in more detail. For example, why is a life with "rhyme and reason" more desirable or more successful than a life without those characteristics?

Chapter Four turns to Nietzsche's theory of mind. Dove argues that Nietzsche's theory incorporates three central claims about the mind's nature and its interaction with the world. The claims are as follows:

(1) Nietzsche rejects the idea of "an objective reality that simply presents itself to us, instead seeing our apprehension of the objects of the world as fundamentally shaped by culture, particularly through language" (58). Dove calls this "anti-realism."

(2) Nietzsche "den[ies] that there are any uninterpreted -- 'self-justifying, intrinsically credible, theory neutral' -- facts for us to discover" (58). Dove calls this "anti-foundationalism."

(3) Nietzsche maintains that an adequate account of subjectivity or consciousness must be "continuous with the rest of science" (58). Dove calls this "detranscendentalization of the subject."

Dove spends most of the chapter showing that it is possible to construct an adequate theory of mind that meets these three criteria. In particular, he argues that Churchland's theory of mind meets the criteria and overcomes various objections raised by Fodor, Searle, and others. If Dove's arguments work, they show that it is possible to develop a coherent theory of mind that incorporates Nietzsche's central claims. In addition, Dove claims that Churchland's model has "deep resonance with Nietzsche's various hypotheses about the nature of the self" (59). In particular, Dove argues that Churchland's connectionism could be used to explain Nietzsche's claims that there is pre-linguistic mental content (65-66), that consciousness emerges from simpler natural processes (70), and that much mental processing occurs without the mediation of a central consciousness (69).

Dove makes a convincing case for these resemblances. However, as Dove himself puts it, "Churchland's reliance upon contemporary work in neurobiology and artificial intelligence … goes far beyond anything that Nietzsche could have imagined" (66). This concession raises a question: how should we understand the results of this chapter? Is Dove simply revealing an interesting fact -- namely, that Nietzsche and Churchland happen to have theories that are similar in their aspirations and basic commitments? Or does the comparison help us to understand Nietzsche, or improve our grasp of some philosophical point? More guidance from Dove on the implications of his argument would have been helpful.

Chapter Five extends the discussion of connectionism, treating both Churchland's attempt to develop an ethical theory and Dennett's arguments for a narrative conception of selfhood. Dove argues that Churchland's ethical theory fails, because it does not provide an adequate role for selfhood and language. Dennett's arguments for a narrative conception of self, in which language plays an essential role, are introduced in order to overcome these problems. With regard to Nietzsche, the claims here take roughly the same form as in Chapter Four: Dennett, and to a lesser extent Churchland, produce models of ethics and selfhood that are in broad conformity with some of Nietzsche's claims. Again, though, it would have been useful for Dove to provide an explanation of what this resemblance between Nietzsche and Dennett establishes.

Chapter Six attempts to tie together the themes addressed in the book. Its ambitions are large. Dove seeks to show that Nietzsche (i) denies traditional conceptions of freedom, (ii) articulates a new conception of freedom, and (iii) shows that attaining this type of freedom involves affirming the eternal recurrence.

With regard to (i), Dove provides a nice overview of Nietzsche's critical discussions of freedom. He interprets Nietzsche as both questioning the motives of those who embrace a libertarian conception of freedom, and arguing that only a defective account of freedom would treat freedom as incompatible with determinism.

Nietzsche's own conception of freedom, Dove argues, is associated with (or perhaps equivalent to) "taking responsibility" for one's own actions (115-123). Dove claims a signal role for this notion of "taking responsibility." He writes, "the active 'taking responsibility' stands at the core of Nietzsche's ethical theory" (120). However, Dove's analysis does not render the notion of 'taking responsibility' fully perspicuous. Perhaps his most explicit definition is this: "One of the key elements that Nietzsche sets forth for taking responsibility is the ability to adhere to something regardless of the personal cost" (122). Taking responsibility thus seems to involve a capacity to persevere in one's goals, despite the difficulty involved in doing so. This raises two questions, though. First, why is this type of perseverance linked to responsibility? Second, why is this type of perseverance something that we should strive to manifest? After all, it could also be interpreted as simple stubbornness: shouldn't we sometimes let a goal go when we recognize that cleaving to it has great personal costs? (An example: if I recognize that my commitment to running a marathon is going to lead to severe personal injury, shouldn't I consider abandoning the goal?)

This brings us to point (iii): the claim that attaining Nietzschean freedom requires affirming the eternal recurrence. The book ends with a series of exceedingly brief arguments on this topic. Dove claims that manifesting Nietzschean freedom requires, "first, finding the requirements necessary for one's flourishing, and second, having the courage and conviction to follow these requirements through, no matter the cost" (123). The second condition, then, is the same as "taking responsibility." Thus, an agent manifests Nietzschean freedom if she takes responsibility and flourishes. Dove also tells us that taking responsibility entails affirming eternal recurrence: "taking responsibility expands one's sphere of concern beyond oneself; by recognizing the interconnectedness of the whole, we can see that the responsibility one takes is identical to the affirmation of the eternal recurrence" (125). However, Dove provides very little argument for this difficult and rather puzzling claim.

As these remarks may indicate, Chapter Six is, in some respects, the least satisfying. It makes a number of claims that depend on concepts that are not fully explicated, and the arguments linking these concepts are rather impressionistic.

Dove's book has strengths. The writing is clear, the arguments are imaginative, and Dove broaches a range of important, central topics. He draws interesting, suggestive connections between Nietzsche's claims and contemporary work in philosophy of mind. Anyone who is interested in exploring these potential similarities will find many helpful claims here. Unfortunately, the book also has some weaknesses. My chief complaint is that certain elements of the book feel rather underdeveloped: some important concepts aren't fully explained, some central arguments are sketched rather than fully explicated, and a number of important questions -- several of which I have flagged above -- are left unanswered. This is due, in part, to the brevity of the book: Dove tackles an enormous range of difficult topics in a mere 127 pages of text. A comprehensive treatment of these topics would have necessitated a much longer book.


Nehamas, A. (1985), Nietzsche: Life as Literature. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.