Nietzsche's Gay Science: Dancing Coherence

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Monika M. Langer, Nietzsche's Gay Science: Dancing Coherence, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 275pp., $33.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780230580695.

Reviewed by Matthew Meyer, The University of Scranton


For many years, Nietzsche studies in the English-speaking world were populated by comprehensive interpretations that focused on concepts, such as the will to power, the overman, and the eternal return, that were thought to be central to Nietzsche's philosophical project.[1] More recently, however, a handful of scholars have turned away from this thematic approach to Nietzsche's thought by focusing their scholarly efforts on the careful analysis of individual texts. The most notable example of this trend has been the recent explosion of work on Nietzsche's On the Genealogy of Morals by prominent scholars such as Daniel Conway, Lawrence Hatab, Christopher Janaway, Brian Leiter, and David Owen.[2] In line with this movement, Monika Langer now offers a commentary on another of Nietzsche's more popular texts, The Gay Science (GS). Although Langer's work is a welcome addition to the secondary literature for its comprehensive, section-by-section approach to GS, her overly narrow focus on the contents of the individual aphorisms to the exclusion of broader reflections on the complex genesis of the text, the role the text plays in Nietzsche's free-spirit project, and the potential relationship of the text to his larger oeuvre compromises the depth and quality of her commentary.

Langer begins by situating her efforts within the existing literature on GS, of which there is surprisingly little. Indeed, the only book-length study dedicated exclusively to GS in the English-speaking world is Kathleen Higgins' Comic Relief: Nietzsche's Gay Science.[3] In agreement with Higgins, Langer stresses the careful orchestration of Nietzsche's work and holds that the task of the commentator is to reveal the order that underlies the apparent chaos of the text. This is in contrast to David Allison,[4] who holds that GS is in fact a chaotic series of disconnected aphorisms. On this debate, Langer and Higgins are certainly right. Nietzsche's aphoristic works might give the appearance of a collection of random, contradictory thoughts on a variety of topics, but as Marco Brusotti has effectively shown,[5] a careful reader will quickly detect consistent and re-occurring themes that Nietzsche consciously develops as the text unfolds.

Although agreeing with Higgins on this point, Langer nevertheless distinguishes herself from Higgins, who adopts a thematic approach to the text, by offering a straightforward commentary that promises to trace a set of central ideas from beginning to end. According to Langer, GS exhibits a consistent concern with three main themes: the de-deification of nature, the naturalization of ourselves, and the beautification of our lives. In de-deifying nature, Langer stresses the fact that, for Nietzsche, abandoning the belief in a supreme deity results in the collapse of an entire moral and epistemological framework. In response to the crisis that the death of God creates, Nietzsche, on Langer's reading, believes that we must reintegrate ourselves with the rest of nature and learn how to beautify our own lives. In developing these themes, Nietzsche dedicates the opening books to overcoming the hindrances to this project, most notably in the form of God and his shadow. As the later books unfold, i.e., after the death of God has been declared in Book Three, Nietzsche spells out the details of what the beautification of our lives involves (Book Four) and why such a project is desirable in Book Five (xv-xvii).

Unfortunately, this is about all Langer has to offer by way of an introduction to the text, as she devotes the remainder of her commentary to a more narrowly focused exposition of the contents of the individual sections. Her all-too-brief introduction is problematic because the genesis of GS is complex, and an understanding of the relevant philological details can shed light on how one should interpret the philosophical significance of the work. First, it is important to note that the text went through two editions. Whereas the first edition (1882) consisted of four books and a prelude of poems under the title "Joke, Cunning, and Revenge," Nietzsche added a preface, a fifth book, and an appendix of songs to the second edition (1887). Langer does mention the differences between the two editions in passing (xii and xiv), but she seems to assume that the reader is already familiar with this point and only later provides a brief reflection on the potential significance of these changes for thinking about GS in relation to Nietzsche's other works, omitting any conversation about the potential link between Book V and Beyond Good and Evil (210).

Moreover, Langer seems oblivious to the fact that Nietzsche initially wrote the first three books of GS as the final three books of Daybreak.[6] This fact not only highlights the distinctive nature of Book Four and the way in which it seems to bridge Nietzsche's free-spirit project with the poetry of Thus Spoke Zarathustra, but also indicates that the death of God and his shadow in Book Three marks the apex of a series of reflections on the "prejudices of morality" that begins in Daybreak. So understood, Nietzsche's claim that "we" have killed God can be interpreted as "we free spirits" who have been hammering away at the foundations of morality since the beginning of Daybreak. Finally, the link between Daybreak and GS is important because it points to the further fact that these texts, along with Human, All Too Human (HH), belong to one project called the "free spirit."[7] Although Langer does talk about the free spirit and free-spiritedness as a concept or ideal in her analysis of GS, she has little, if anything, to say about the free spirit as a series of texts and the way in which GS functions as the concluding work of Nietzsche's free-spirit project.

Reading GS within the context of the free spirit is important because it allows one to make better sense of what Nietzsche's gay science might be. For Langer, Nietzsche's gay science is to be read in opposition to a philosophical tradition, epitomized by Descartes, that seeks indubitable foundations for timelessly valued truths (1). More specifically, Nietzsche's gay science calls upon the tradition of the troubadour to renounce traditional philosophy's "pretension to possess a monopoly on truth, and its consequent devaluation of poetry" (1; also see 217). However, reading in the context of the free spirit, one cannot help but think that Nietzsche's gay science is not, first and foremost, an attack on traditional philosophy's commitment to, say, binary oppositions (1), for this was precisely the issue in the first section of HH, but rather it is meant to replace or overcome what might be called the "gray" science of HH. On this reading, HH depicts a gray science because it adopts the traditional philosopher's belief that truth has an absolute value and therefore that one ought, as a moral duty, pursue truth at all costs. By contrast, GS depicts Nietzsche's gradual liberation, through the death of God and his shadow, from what one might call the morality of truth (GS 344) and, as a consequence of this event, the eventual transformation of science into an experiment that is ready to unite with life and laughter in becoming a gay science.

In addition to situating the work within the context of the free-spirit project, one could argue that the full significance of GS can only be understood in relation to the works that follow. As commentators like Allison and Brusotti have recognized, section 324, "In media vita," suggests that GS is a medial book in that it stands "at the midpoint of [Nietzsche's] life and serve[s] as a fulcrum for his subsequent thought."[8] Here, Langer should be credited for referencing throughout her commentary Thus Spoke Zarathustra and its relationship to the ideas expressed in GS. However, she misses a number of what seem to be proleptic references to what would become Nietzsche's autobiography, Ecce Homo (EH). Although she makes the obvious point of linking the penultimate poem of the prelude, which carries the title "Ecce homo," to Nietzsche's later work (24), she provides very little discussion of the final aphorisms of Book Three (see 161), where Nietzsche introduces, in section 270, the notion of becoming who one is, a theme first expressed in Schopenhauer as Educator and repeated in the all-important section 335 of GS. The link between becoming who one is and EH is obvious not only because the phrase constitutes the subtitle of the book, but also because Nietzsche refers back to the aphorisms that surround section 270 in EH, where he tells us that here one "reads the granite words in which a destiny finds for the first time a formula for itself, for all time" (EH Books: "The Gay Science" 1).

The fact that Langer leaves much of this out of her account is perhaps the greatest shortcoming of her work. As for the ground that she does cover, her analysis ranges from an accurate, but sometimes tedious, paraphrasing of Nietzsche's views to informative and insightful comments that supply the reader with necessary background information and illuminate the interconnectedness of seemingly disparate aphorisms. As a particular instance of the latter, Langer offers an extended analysis of Nietzsche's claim, in the 1887 preface, that the truth might be the Greek fertility goddess Baubo (9ff.), and Langer traces this theme, along with Nietzsche's sometimes blatantly sexist remarks about women, throughout the text. As a more general point, the most refreshing aspect of Langer's book is the fact that she gives equal weight to the philosophical and artistic elements of GS. Too often, those working on Nietzsche focus on one of these facets at the expense of the other. For a commentary on GS, keeping these two elements in balance is particularly important because the work can be read as Nietzsche's attempt to heal the rift between art and science that the morality of truth at work in HH created.

Langer highlights the artistic elements of the work, first, by providing commentary on the poetry found at the beginning of the text -- "Joke, Cunning, and Revenge" -- and at the end of the second edition -- "Songs of Prince Vogelfrei". In both cases, Langer rightly sees such poetry as an expression of a playful and free spirit who has overcome the gravity and reverence that typifies traditional philosophizing (14). As Langer notes, the mocking spirit of the "Songs" points back to Nietzsche's remark at the conclusion of Book Two that we need to see ourselves as both heroes and fools (GS 107). On this point, Langer is certainly on target with her analysis, and she could have just as easily pointed to the dual emphasis on tragedy and comedy in sections 1 and 153 of GS. In addition to her discussions of Nietzsche's poetry, she frequently comments on his views on music and sometimes subjects these to a fair critique (109ff.). Finally, the title of Langer's book is often reflected in her commentary as she repeatedly emphasizes the significance of dance. Not only does she claim, in her preface, that the "Nietzschean philosopher's goal is to be 'a good dancer'" (xvii), but also that GS itself should be regarded as a dance (257).

In addition to commenting on the poetic aspects of the work, Langer turns her attention to the philosophical views that Nietzsche expresses in GS. Although she reads Nietzsche in a way that finds some support in the secondary literature, her analysis does give the impression that she herself has not struggled with the numerous difficulties that seem to plague Nietzsche's thought and have animated extended discussions in the secondary literature. This is because when the theoretical issues become thorny, as they do in crucial sections like 110, 341, and 344, she often acknowledges their complexity and then refers those looking for a more thorough treatment to the work of someone like Maudemarie Clark (135n7 and 228n2). Although Clark's Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy has received a great deal of attention since its publication, much of this attention has been in the form of criticism,[9] and Langer does not bother to point the reader to alternative interpretations that have been published since the appearance of Clark's book in 1990.

Moreover, Langer's own reading of Nietzsche on truth and knowledge not only seems to be at odds with Clark's interpretation, but also seems to attribute to Nietzsche the kind of inconsistency that Clark endeavors to avoid. On the one hand, Langer argues that Nietzsche's work represents an attack on the hierarchical, binary oppositions of traditional philosophy such as those between mind and body, reason and sensibility, subject and object (1). While such a view certainly finds support at the beginning of both HH and Beyond Good and Evil, Langer's later remarks problematize her initial position. Specifically, she claims that all scientific descriptions are simply anthropomorphic projections onto an otherwise chaotic world. However, if we ask for a justification of such a view, Langer tells us that Nietzsche refrains from offering one, as he "would be the first to acknowledge that his view is an interpretation" (123).

The problem with such a reading is three-fold. Theoretically, it undermines the force of Nietzsche's attack on the traditional philosopher's commitment to opposites. So construed, Nietzsche's conception of a world in which there are no opposites is just one more anthropomorphic projection among others and therefore we have no more reason for endorsing such a view for its alethic merits than the traditional philosopher's belief that reality is divided into opposites. Textually, such a reading does not sit well with Nietzsche's talk of "error" in section 110 of GS. Quite simply, for Nietzsche to be able to declare in rather dogmatic fashion that there are no enduring substances or anything like free will, he seems to need enough non-anthropomorphic access to the world to know that such concepts do not apply. Finally, a work like HH suggests that Nietzsche does seek to justify his rejection of binary opposites through an appeal to the natural sciences (HH 1). If this is correct, then it cannot be the case that all scientific understandings of the world are anthropomorphic projections. Instead, only those that divide the world into binary opposites and populate it with self-identical things that exist and persist through time are rejected as having an unwitting anthropomorphic character about them.

In conclusion, it is perhaps best to say that Langer has provided a commentary that may be helpful to those working on GS and therefore her work should be consulted for its potential insights into a text that can often be quite opaque. Moreover, she should be commended for keeping both the poetic and the philosophical dimensions of the work in focus and for highlighting the careful orchestration that runs throughout the text. Nevertheless, Langer's treatment overlooks some key issues that are crucial for understanding GS as a whole and its position within Nietzsche's larger corpus, and therefore one hopes that Langer's work will inspire further scholarly efforts to grapple with one of Nietzsche's most interesting, important, and complex creations.

[1] See Walter Kaufmann, Nietzsche: Philosopher, Psychologist, Antichrist. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1974; Arthur Danto, Nietzsche as Philosopher, New York: Columbia University Press, 1965; Richard Schacht, Nietzsche, New York: Routledge, 1983.

[2] See Daniel Conway, Nietzsche's On the Genealogy of Morals: A Reader's Guide, London: Continuum, 2008; Lawrence J. Hatab, Nietzsche's On the Genealogy of Morals: An Introduction, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008; Christopher Janaway, Beyond Selflessness: Reading Nietzsche's Genealogy, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007; Brian Leiter, Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Nietzsche on Morality, London: Routledge, 2002; David Owen, Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morality, Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press, 2007.

[3] Kathleen Marie Higgins, Comic Relief: Nietzsche's Gay Science, New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.

[4] David Allison, Reading the New Nietzsche, New York: Rowan and Littlefield Publishers, 2001.

[5] Marco Brusotti, Die Leidenschaft der Erkenntnis: Philosophie und aesthetische Lebensgestaltung bei Nietzsche von Morgenroethe bis Also sprach Zarathustra, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1997.

[6] See Friedrich Nietzsche, Kritische Studien Ausgabe, ed. G. Colli and M. Montinari, Vol. 14, p. 230, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1999.

[7] See Friedrich Nietzsche, The Gay Science, trans. W. Kaufmann, New York: Vintage, 1974, p. 30.

[8] Allison, p. 72.

[9] See, for instance, Christoph Cox, Nietzsche: Naturalism and Interpretation, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1999; and Michael Steven Green, Nietzsche and the Transcendental Tradition, Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002.