Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morality

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David Owen, Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morality, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2007, 175pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773533493.

Reviewed by Peter Poellner, University of Warwick


The last decade has seen a flurry of publications on Nietzsche's ethics and specifically on his critique of "morality" put forward in On the Genealogy of Morality. In addition to a host of journal articles and essay collections, there have been book-length studies of the subject by, among others, Aaron Ridley (Nietzsche's Conscience, 1998), Simon May (Nietzsche's Ethics and his War on "Morality", 1999), Brian Leiter (Nietzsche on Morality, 2002), and Chris Janaway (Beyond Selflessness: Reading Nietzsche's Genealogy, 2007). David Owen's book is the latest addition to this growing literature. It is plausible to think that this surge of interest reflects a growing acknowledgement among philosophers in the English-speaking world that Nietzsche's ideas on ethics and morality are of continuing relevance for contemporary thought. But while there has been increasing willingness to engage with Nietzsche among philosophers trained in the analytic tradition, there continues to be fierce disagreement on the merits and precise significance of his contribution, and indeed on its content. Much effort has been expended in recent years on clarifying or reconstructing Nietzsche's challenge, and on excavating the argumentative structures beneath his polemics, while also making sense of the rhetorical idiosyncrasies of his distinctive philosophical style. As a result, we now have a much clearer and more detailed picture of the various interpretive options and are in a correspondingly better position than a few decades ago to assess the merits of the philosophical positions to which Nietzsche may plausibly be thought to be committed.

Owen's valuable book offers a sustained, clear, crisply argued reconstruction of Nietzsche's central arguments in On the Genealogy of Morality as well as some thoughtful explanatory ideas on Nietzsche's incendiary style in this text, situating both in the context of the development of his thought on morality following his break with his early ethics of heroic love and self-sacrifice (inspired partly by Schopenhauer and Wagner) in Human, All-Too-Human. In Owen's account of this development, Nietzsche's point of departure since Daybreak is the "death of God", the loss of belief in the Christian God among the cultured classes dramatized as the urbane atheism of the people in the marketplace in §125 of The Gay Science. The people in the marketplace consider the loss of authority of the metaphysical beliefs associated with Christianity to be a process that need have no implications for their practical orientation in life, an orientation that remains structured by a certain conception of morality continuous with "Christian" morality. For Nietzsche, by contrast, morality thus understood is rationally dependent on the truth of those now widely abandoned metaphysical beliefs: "When one gives up Christian belief one thereby deprives oneself of the right to Christian morality" (TI, "Expeditions of an Untimely Man", §5). Nietzsche's task, as he conceives of it from The Gay Science onwards, is therefore threefold: he needs to provide a broadly naturalistic explanation of the hold that "morality" continues to have -- irrationally, by his lights -- even on unbelievers; he needs to come up with an adequate evaluative framework permitting him to determine the "value of morality" as a self-standing practice deprived of its metaphysical trappings; and he needs to tell us something about the criteria for assessing evaluative commitments. The last requirement is particularly challenging for him as he is committed to "perspectivism", a view which Owen interprets as the epistemological claim that justification is necessarily relative to practical perspectives constituted by specific, contingent interests and purposes -- and that the idea of a practical justification valid for all rational beings merely qua rational beings is incoherent.

But what is the "morality" criticised by Nietzsche? Owen identifies six features, each of which (I take it, though Owen is not explicit on this point) would be separately sufficient for an ethical outlook to be subject to Nietzsche's attack: (a) the idea of moral action as unegoistic (selfless, self-denying, compassionate); (b) an interpretation of suffering as rightful punishment and a concomitant emphasis on the reflective emotion of guilt; (c) a certain conception of free will, involving the idea that agents could have acted otherwise in the circumstances than they in fact did; (d) a privileging of "slave" values such as obedience and humility and a devaluation of "noble" values such as pride and audacity; (e) a conception of morality as involving unconditional obligations; and (f) a conception of morality as universally applicable or binding (cf. Owen, p. 69).

Owen plausibly argues that each of the three Essays of the Genealogy addresses primarily one pair out of these six features: the bad conscience (features a and b, Essay 2), the slave revolt in morality (c and d, Essay 1), and the ascetic ideal (e and f, Essay 3). Taken together, the three Essays describe a complex socio-cultural process, supplying a non-reductionist, yet naturalistic explanation of the hold that "morality" has historically had on us. Owen devotes a chapter to each Essay and comes close to succeeding in the difficult task of weaving a coherent story from the complex tangle of threads in Nietzsche's narrative, showing good sense and sound judgement in the process. The genealogical story as reconstructed by Owen goes roughly like this: "slave values" (c and d above) originate in a post-tribal political community in which a group of "nobles" brutally rules over and instrumentalizes another group as slaves. The slaves in this setting cannot experience their agency as largely their own, nor can they experience and think of their typical capacities and dispositions as having intrinsic (rather than instrumental) value as long as they think in the evaluative terms espoused by their masters who value the very traits that enable them to express their agency -- by ruling over the slaves, among other things. Since human beings, according to Owen's Nietzsche, are characterized by a fundamental desire to experience themselves as agents, and the slaves cannot express this desire in physical action, there develops among them, unintentionally, an alternative evaluative perspective enabling them to conceive of and experience their very powerlessness as a kind of power -- as their agency. This picture comprises, first, a notion of virtue in terms of the typical character traits of the slaves (humility, etc.) and, secondly, a concept of free choice according to which practising the slave virtues is a merit, not only in the sense of being good or praiseworthy, but presumably also in the sense of deserving favourable treatment or reward. Owen does not stress the point, but it seems that it is the latter idea in particular which requires a construal of free will in terms of a libertas indifferentiae ("x could have done otherwise"). In any case, Owen agrees with most other interpreters of the slaves' ressentiment values that the new evaluative picture is not one that the slaves are genuinely committed to -- their apparent commitment to humility (etc.) is self-deceived (p. 87) and in reality expresses a desire for power over the nobles (p. 80).

According to the genealogical story of Essay 2 as Owen reconstructs it, the valuation of selflessness, self-denial, and altruism is the product of an instinct or desire towards cruelty, taken as basic by Nietzsche, and turned inward by a subjugated pre-historical slave population due to the practical impossibility of its outward-directed expression. Nietzsche proposes that valuing "unegoistic" actions and dispositions requires such a willed exercise of cruelty against one's own "animal self", and the "bad conscience" simply is the instinct for cruelty thus re-directed by subjects against themselves in conditions where they are unable to give external vent to it. In a further move, according to Owen's Nietzsche, this self-mistreatment reaches its climax in the moralization of the creditor-debtor scheme constitutive for early, pre-Christian religion. The archaic religious notion that a debt, an obligation, is owed to a deified ancestor transmutes in the slaves' minds, under the aegis of the bad conscience, into the experience of an unrepayable debt to God and into the thought that one's suffering is a punishment for this debt ("guilt"). This conception of one's earthly existence being per se "guilty" is a manifestation of what Nietzsche calls the ascetic ideal, analysed in Essay 3. In his interpretation of this, Owen adopts an argument of Aaron Ridley's, suggesting that there is a surplus of suffering still unaccounted for by the slaves' self-empowerment described in Essay 1. Since any physical deeds which they could regard as their own are denied to them, the question "why exist at all?", ineluctably weighing upon them throughout their oppressed, suffering lives, finds no satisfactory immanentist answer. What they are thus drawn to is a conception of the fundamental features of life itself -- its contingent, perspectival, affect-laden, bodily, time-and-place bound character -- as having their point or end outside this natural life, in a metaphysical or otherwise "unconditioned" domain construed as lacking those features. In this way the attraction of both the idea of unconditional, purely rational demands and obligations, and of a non-perspectival, absolute truth, is accounted for in terms of the contingencies of the slaves' form of existence.

This sociocultural genealogy of "morality" is intended in the spirit of enlightenment as a criticism, not merely displaying Nietzsche' own anti-morality affects, but also offering us good reasons for its re-valuation. And the "us" here includes those inhabiting the perspective of morality. What is needed to be convinced of this need, Owen argues, is only a commitment to truth, shared by the Christian perspective and by Nietzsche's free spirit, and acceptance of the truth of Nietzsche's genealogical explanations. The criticism of morality can thus be taken, in part, as an immanent one. An adherent of morality cannot both accept its truth and remain committed to the values of morality, for these values include a rejection of the motives which, if Nietzsche is right, underpin morality -- motives such as cruelty, the desire for revenge and for power. But the criteria by which morality is recognizable as standing in need of re-valuation are not merely immanent in this sense -- otherwise Nietzsche himself would have no sufficient reason to reject all of its central elements, being himself untroubled by what the Christians regard as vices (such as a basic interest in power).

This brings us to Nietzsche's own alternative evaluative framework, the elucidation of which includes some of this illuminating book's most interesting contributions. For Owen, Nietzsche' own criterion of evaluation of practical perspectives is tied to the notion of the will to power. One central claim he associates with this concept is that self-conscious beings like ourselves have a fundamental interest in experiencing their power or agency. Now, the experience of power can be misleading -- it need not track actual power or agency. Nietzsche evaluates practical perspectives according to whether the experiences of agency they involve necessarily express and track actual agency. If human beings really are characterized by the will to power, then it seems that, whatever their practical perspective, they cannot rationally reject this criterion. Just as a believer must be committed to truth as a criterion of success of his belief, so a person with an interest in experiencing power must be committed to his experience being veridical, i.e. to its registering actual power (cf. Owen, p. 36). The crucial question for Nietzsche therefore is: under what conditions does the experience of agency necessarily track and express agency? It does so, Owen argues, just in case the values by which we act are self-determined. Self-determined or free agency is agency which satisfies two conditions: first, such agency involves commitments which the agent is capable of appraising and potentially changing through reflective self-scrutiny. Secondly, self-determination is a self-relation exemplified by the relationship of an artist to his work, in which:

(i) one's actions are expressive of one's intentions where this means that one's intention-in-acting is not prior to its expression but rather is realized as such only in being adequately expressed (the work is his to the degree that it adequately expresses his intentions and his intentions become choate as his intentions only through their adequate expression) and (ii) one's activity appeals to no authority independent of, or external to, the norms that govern the practice in which one is engaged. (p. 38)

When Nietzsche, in GM II §2, expresses the hope that "sovereign" individuals may eventually emerge from the processes of socialization described in the Genealogy, he means self-determined agents in this sense. Such self-determination is the envisaged telos of the activity of re-valuation he engages in and recommends to his readers.

Owen's book will be found valuable by beginners as well as by advanced students and scholars of Nietzsche. It is one of the clearest and most powerful statements of Nietzsche's case in On the Genealogy of Morality. Owen's reconstruction of the critical-genealogical bulk of Nietzsche's text has the merit of presenting a theory with mostly clear contours that is worth taking seriously. What the book lacks, however, is an extensive critical engagement with the Nietzschean positions it delineates -- its objective seems to be primarily to lay the foundations for such an engagement. Let me, in conclusion, adumbrate a few particularly salient and pressing problems raised by Nietzsche's narrative as recounted in this book. First the immanent critical strategy concerning slave values like humility in Essay 1 can only avoid being an egregious instance of the genetic fallacy if Nietzsche can show that the self-deceptive elements supposedly present in the original ressentiment situation are still present among the adherents of slave values subsequent to that moment of origin. But might not these values have acquired an intrinsic authority of their own capable of withstanding rational self-scrutiny? In order to adjudicate between Nietzsche's and alternative accounts (e.g. Max Scheler's), a more detailed phenomenological description would be needed of what a supposed virtue like humility actually is. Also, Owen's account, while for the most part admirably lucid, is ambiguous on what the self-empowerment of the slaves consists in. If it is primarily revenge on the nobles, then this objective was after all, over time, actually achieved. The slaves' experience of power in that case correctly anticipated real power. If, however, the slaves' self-empowerment consists primarily in their being able to value themselves, then one problem here is whether such self-valuation is possible by self-deceivingly identifying with a set of supposed values which are only experienceable through self-deception. Such a picture of "value-creation" is of doubtful coherence, as I have argued elsewhere. One might try to circumvent this problem by saying that the slaves' real commitments (e.g. their hatred of the nobles' power) are unconscious, but this would be a desperate move, making the success of Nietzsche's account contingent upon a controversial heavy-duty theory of unconscious mental states with its attendant epistemological and ontological problems.

With respect to Nietzsche's own criteria of evaluation as interpreted by Owen, one question here is if what matters primarily for Nietzsche is whether the feeling of power necessarily tracks actual power/agency (as Owen would have it), irrespective of what its content may be, or whether what is most important for him is the appropriate orientation of agents towards the value contents of their actions. The expressivist picture of "artistic" intention is only relevant, it seems, on the first construal. But I remain unconvinced that it really matters centrally to Nietzsche whether (i) the sovereign individual only recognizes his intentions in and through his works, and whether (ii) the values he comes to acknowledge have their origins in social practices and institutions which he has fully internalized through socialization into a tradition (cf. p. 101). Even if such socialization "all the way down" is contingently a condition, for us, of internalizing values, it is a separate question whether it is constitutive of any activity Nietzsche would be prepared to regard as sovereign agency, or as realizing/expressing "higher values". What should make us cautious with respect to the latter claims is that the proposed constraints (i) and (ii) may easily be met by many actions which we, and surely Nietzsche, would consider quite insignificant or petty. My misgivings here apply, admittedly, not merely to Owen's but to any purely formal specification of Nietzsche's own standards of evaluation. If we want to do justice to Nietzsche on this central issue, I suspect we cannot avoid discussing substantive issues of value contents.