Nietzsche's New Darwinism

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John Richardson, Nietzsche's New Darwinism, Oxford University Press, 2004, 300pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195171039.

Reviewed by Jessica N. Berry, The University of North Carolina at Wilmington


If the publication of Darwin's Origin of Species in 1859 was a watershed in the history of Western thought, it was not due merely to his suggestion that modern species were revised descendents of earlier ones. Rather, it was that Darwin had identified the precise mechanism by which one species could be revised into another, biologically distinct species. Darwin's proposal of evolution by natural selection gave immediate direction to research in the biological sciences, and it allowed the theory to begin doing important work in that arena (and beyond) by eventually closing the only significant explanatory gap that might otherwise have hindered its widespread acceptance. In his most recent book, John Richardson proposes to make Nietzsche's views on morality more coherent, more credible, and ultimately more useful by demonstrating that they are underwritten by a modified Darwinism that identifies the thoroughly naturalistic mechanisms by which human beings come to have the moral values and practices they do and through which they might realize the possibility of creating new, healthier values.

As even casual readers of Nietzsche will observe, the bulk of what Nietzsche has to say about Darwin and Darwinism is hostile. Richardson rightly points out that Nietzsche has a perhaps regrettable but nonetheless reliable tendency to bite off the hand that feeds him; the thinkers of whom he is most critical are often those from whom he takes the most inspiration. But his intellectual relationship to Darwin is more complicated still. As Richardson's examination of Nietzsche's position shows, Nietzsche's attacks appear to get wrong both Darwin's position and the biological facts of the matter. The central motif in Nietzsche's criticism of Darwin seems to be that Darwin lays too much stress on survival, and too little on power [18]. But in offering this criticism, Nietzsche "misidentifies the selective criterion in Darwinism," which is not survival, but reproduction. Moreover, "Nietzsche seems to misread Darwinian survival as an 'end' in too literal a sense: as the aim of a will or drive or instinct" in the individual [22]. It looks as if Nietzsche has missed something important about Darwinism -- namely, that it is not hopelessly teleological, but manages to handle the idea of 'ends' or 'aims' in an entirely naturalistic way. If this is the case, however, it appears that Nietzsche's hostile reaction to Darwin and his subsequent 'correction' of Darwinism are grounded in error. Richardson argues, however, that these errors might be peripheral after all, and that Nietzsche might really appreciate the main thrust of the Darwinian position. "What if," he asks, "[Nietzsche] gets right, after all, the sense of Darwinian selection -- how it is and isn't teleology -- and builds his own will to power and drives in parallel?" [24] Richardson's aim is to demonstrate that the weight of textual evidence favors our reading Nietzsche in this way, and makes it more than just "wishful thinking" [25]. I will return to this point below.

Richardson intends to show that, hostile remarks notwithstanding, Nietzsche not only accepts the core of Darwin's theory, but that he appropriates it for critical purposes of his own and even builds on it in ways that anticipate contemporary extensions of evolutionary theory within the social sciences; e.g., the analysis of social change and development in terms of memes (replicators that play a role in the transmission of cultural beliefs and practices analogous to the role played by genes in the transmission of physiological characteristics). Specifically, Richardson argues that Nietzsche recognizes a type of selection the Darwinists miss, one that operates over human societies rather than individuals [43]. The Darwinian insights Nietzsche borrows and the introduction of his new supra-Darwinian mechanism for social selection allow him to construct a wholly naturalistic account of our values, their origin and functions; they lay the groundwork for Nietzsche's diagnosis of some values as "unhealthy," and they point the way toward "freedom" as a value that Nietzsche can endorse without violating either his rejection of a metaphysically free will or his observation that values are always indexed to some specific "perspective."

In the first of his four chapters, Richardson presents a thorough and careful picture of Nietzsche's biology, drawn along Darwinian lines. Readers of Nietzsche's System (Oxford University Press, 1996) will be familiar with the centrality Richardson accords Nietzsche's notion of "will to power," but here he (happily, in my view) widens the scope. Richardson says he has in no way retreated from the view developed in the earlier work: that we find in Nietzsche a systematic (metaphysical) theory of being in which power is ontologically basic, and in light of which we ought to understand the rest of Nietzsche's ideas. But in this new work, he concedes the "small plausibility" this metaphysical theory has for most of us, and gives readers concerned that the notion of will to power is "too isolated (or too Nachlass-bound) a notion to be worth worrying over" a new focus: now, he treats biological "drives," talk of which is pervasive in both the published and unpublished work, as Nietzsche's principal explanatory tokens [12-13].

Simply put, drives are dispositions to behave in certain ways; but importantly, they are dispositions to behave in ways that aim at specific results and that have been selected for their (highly plastic) tendencies to achieve their results. On the face of it, the notion that any purely physiological characteristic might have built-in 'aims' looks anathema to a thinker who so stridently rejects teleology. But herein lies one of the central virtues of Nietzsche's Darwinism -- it affords Nietzsche what Richardson refers to as a "thin" teleology, one that is able to acknowledge the end-directedness of drives naturalistically, without anthropomorphizing or implicitly relying on some vestigial intentionality [26]. Hunger, for example, is a drive that 'aims' at eating, an activity that promotes survival and ultimately contributes to fitness (reproductive success). Clearly, in this case, the 'aiming' need not be conscious and its contribution to the overall end of reproductive success need not be evident; nevertheless, Richardson says, the outcome (eating) and its contribution to the overall end together explain the presence of the drive and the behavior it causes. What Darwinism offers is precisely a new model for teleology, a stripped-down version that Nietzsche need not reject because it makes clear how drives can be goal-oriented in an entirely non-cognitive way.

If the story is a bit more complicated for Nietzsche, it is because of the relationship between the economy of our various drives and "will to power." Nietzsche's New Darwinism offers two different suggestions for how we might understand that relationship. On the one hand, Richardson wants to say that "in his metaphysical moods, Nietzsche thinks that although drives may well be shaped by selection, this selection works on a raw material supplied to it by and as will to power itself" [46]. Will to power and natural selection would thus be independent and competing explanations for the behavior of organisms. How the two explanations co-exist in Nietzsche's work and how the "cosmic force" that is will to power can be squared with other views he holds, including especially his naturalism, would in this case demand an independent account. (Such was the project of Nietzsche's System.) On the other hand, we could say that "the drives that have best served reproductive success and that dominate the drive economy of most organisms are drives whose goals involve some kind of control, either over other organisms, or over other drives in the same organism" [55]. This is the "least metaphysical" reading of the relationship: natural selection is basic on this account, and (many) drives are selected to 'aim' not at survival or reproductive success, but at power.

Now these two interpretations are in obvious tension with one another. Cleaving to the central thesis of Nietzsche's System, Richardson remains convinced that the first is Nietzsche's "dominant" view. However, the 'concerned readers' mentioned above (of which I must admit I am one) will be pleased that he argues for the second "minority" view [6-7], offering an alternative that abandons the ontological and epistemic priority of will to power. The troubling feature of this strategy emerges with Richardson's frequent reminders that Nietzsche holds both views, with no awareness of their incompatibility. Nietzsche's actual position seems to be, like his understanding of Darwinism, simply confused: each "is a view Nietzsche sometimes thinks and states" [46], and although he is more deeply committed to the power ontology, "he does sometimes think the second, more fully Darwinian point" [6]. That is, when he is at his best, "he sometimes thinks of will to power [as explained by selection]," rather than the other way around [52]. It is difficult to see how our being forced to recognize that Nietzsche maintains contradictory views can help us appreciate the sophistication of the position built on the view to which he is in fact less committed.

I highlight this issue as an instance of a more general concern about this biological theory and the eloquent expression it finds in Richardson's book: simply put, the more elegant the view becomes and the greater explanatory power it gains, the less persuaded I am that it is Nietzsche's view. Nietzsche's failure to grasp a substantive inconsistency in the very foundation of this theory, coupled with the sometimes crude mischaracterizations of Darwinism that Nietzsche harbors, as we have seen above, and finally, the fact that Nietzsche seems to offer no independent observational evidence for this theory of selection are all serious obstacles to the acceptance of this position as a well-supported Nietzschean position. Richardson is careful never to oversell his interpretation, and he consistently emphasizes its claim to 'rational reconstruction'. But on the other hand, this new Darwinian account offers quite a lot: It promises to solve long-standing interpretive puzzles, like the apparent paradox between Nietzsche's 'fatalism' and his exhortations to create ourselves. It promises to help us understand how Nietzsche can lobby for particular values even as he claims that his values are 'just his' and 'always relative to a perspective'. It promises to give concrete and literal content to such central Nietzschean concepts as 'health' and 'sickness' and to afford us a more precise understanding of Nietzsche's 'genealogical' method. With all that turns potentially on this view, it is tempting to want more and clearer evidence of Nietzsche's having consciously constructed it.

Richardson makes a compelling case that this Darwinism, in its broadest strokes, can be plausibly and fruitfully attributed to Nietzsche. Whether its subtler details can be found there must be decided by a more careful consideration of the wealth of textual references Richardson marshals in support of his interpretation than I can provide in the context of a review. Fortunately, though, what he goes on to do in the remainder of the book does not stand or fall with the acceptance or rejection of the strongest version of Nietzsche's Darwinian biology. Each of Richardson's three subsequent chapters investigates a central area of Nietzsche's philosophy -- his metaethics, his ethics and politics, and his aesthetics, respectively -- and aims to show how the Darwinian reading can reveal the connections among them and help provide justification even for the views that appear most controversial.

Chapter 2 presses the analysis of drives (as plastic dispositions to behave in ways that aim at a particular goal) into the service of constructing an account of values: "values are precisely the goals of an organism's drives or wills" [69]. It follows that we have some of our "values" unconsciously; they are built into our physiology by the process of natural selection. In this sense, all animals "value." Other "values," those we and Nietzsche are most interested in, are "values" in our more ordinary sense -- moral values, in particular. These values are also the result of selection, but in this case the selective mechanism (which from our standpoint operates largely invisibly) is social. The point of doing genealogy is to bring the same scientific investigative principles to bear on values that evolutionary biology brings to bear on the heritable characteristics of animal physiology. It aims to make this social selective process visible and explain how it happens that herds of human beings come to have the values they do. Among other things, genealogy reveals that the mechanism of social selection benefits the herd and not the individual. In fact, social selection tends to benefit the herd at the expense of the individual, when human beings acquire values (dispositions to behave in ways) that come into direct and violent conflict with the aims of drives they have by natural selection. Richardson develops the idea of this internal conflict into a persuasive naturalistic account of what Nietzsche means by diagnosing certain values as "sick," and he explores further here and in Chapter 3 whether we might find in Nietzsche a prescription for how (at least some) human beings might restore their "health" [77-78]. Briefly, he suggests that the new epistemic powers and insights we gain by doing genealogy make possible a new kind of value selection that is unlike either the natural selection operating on individuals or the social selection operating on groups. Richardson calls this new mechanism "self-selection," and he uses his Darwinian reading to argue that this is how we should understand the idea of freedom, a value that Nietzsche not only embraces for himself but that he also promotes for select readers: "The key to becoming myself is to select my values, i.e., the goals of the dispositions that -- in making my behavior -- specify 'who I am'" [96]. This understanding of freedom is pivotal to Richardson's account, since he intends to use the connections between Nietzsche and Darwin not only to illuminate Nietzsche's critical (destructive) project but also to demonstrate that Nietzsche has a constructive account of valuing.

Here, my concern is whether Richardson is too optimistic about genealogy's potential. I wonder first whether, in order for genealogy to make freedom and self-selection a genuine possibility, it must lay completely bare the etiology of the relevant drives. If we think of it as a science in the manner suggested here, this expectation of it seems reasonable. Moreover, Richardson asserts that this is in fact its goal: "The meanings of our drives and practices, what they are truly after ('for'), lie in this evolutionary history" [35]. And, even more strongly: "Meaning is settled by genealogy" [78]. But this view sits somewhat uncomfortably with one of Nietzsche's best-known illustrations of the genealogical method, i.e., his discussion of punishment in the second essay of The Genealogy of Morality. Richardson draws our attention to the passage in which Nietzsche claims that "the previous history of punishment in general, the history of its exploitation for the most various purposes, finally crystallizes into a kind of unity that is hard to dissolve, hard to analyze and, what one must emphasize, quite completely undefinable" [42; cf. GM II: 13]. Yet he seems to play down the claim about "undefinability" that has attracted so much attention to this passage. While the genealogy prerequisite for freedom is, on Richardson's account, never easy work and certainly not for the faint-of-heart, it must still -- after the hard work is done -- yield "settled" meanings in order for self-selection to proceed effectively. But Nietzsche gives us no clear reason to suppose that genealogy, even properly practiced, can settle any such thing decisively. Secondly, on this reading, "valuing freely, as self selecting one's values, is precisely to value in the light of an understanding of why one values" [107]. Here, I wonder whether we undercut the radical nature of Nietzsche's "immoralism" by seeing that, in the end, Nietzsche is just a more enlightened valuer than others. Though Richardson gestures at Nietzsche's stridently avowed opposition to the Enlightenment and its values, he says, "his conception of the benefits of genealogy shows that he really aims at a novel kind of enlightenment" [217]. But the novelty may be underemphasized here, with the result that we get a more coherent Nietzsche at the cost of having one we recognize.

There is a great deal more of interest in Richardson's final chapters. In Chapter 3, for instance, he takes on the thorny issue of Nietzsche's affiliation with Social Darwinism. Here, Richardson takes a line that will be surprising to many, that there are agreements between Nietzsche and the Social Darwinists; but again, he uses a more subtle interpretation of Nietzsche's view to demonstrate that the agreements are less significant than the differences, and that the differences point Nietzsche in a very different direction. Chapter 4 will be of particular value for those interested in Nietzsche's aesthetics, but not only for them. Since Richardson's overall purpose is to present a reading of Nietzsche's theory of value that gives that theory its best chance of being true, he realizes that he is compelled to consider Nietzsche's perennial reminder that his values are intended (merely) "aesthetically," and what is worse, Nietzsche's equally frequent declaration that aesthetic works are "lies." He ends the book with an attempt to bring even these disparate and difficult comments under the purview of his synoptic reading and vigorous defense of Nietzsche's views.

Nietzsche's New Darwinism exemplifies the virtues that have long characterized Richardson's work and that have over the last two decades increasingly characterized the best scholarly work on Nietzsche: it is meticulously organized and carefully argued, with scrupulous attention to the demand for textual evidence in support of the interpretations it offers. The prose is lucid and the arguments transparent in a way that non-specialists in Nietzsche (and perhaps even some specialists) might never have expected that writing about Nietzsche could be. This book will be of particular interest, of course, to Nietzsche specialists who want to understand him within the context of the history of ideas and the history of science in the nineteenth century, and it is in this sense an important contribution to a lively and ongoing conversation. But I would recommend this work strongly to two other types of readers, who might otherwise miss its value for them. First, no specialist on Nietzsche who regards the "naturalist" readings of his work as controversial can afford to overlook it. Nietzsche's New Darwinism will force such readers to engage head-on a powerful set of reasons to embrace Nietzsche as a naturalistic thinker. Second, I would note that this book's clear and careful presentation of the issues makes it accessible to any patient and philosophically informed reader. Thus, anyone whose interest has been piqued by the presentation of Nietzsche's views in such popular works as Dennett's Darwin's Dangerous Idea (Simon and Schuster, 1995) owes it to himself to consider a more detailed, textually sensitive, and sympathetic development of Nietzsche's position.