Nietzsche's Ontology

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Laird Addis, Nietzsche's Ontology, Ontos, 2013, 145pp., $50.00 (pbk), ISBN 9783868381658.

Reviewed by Matthew Meyer, The University of Scranton


Laird Addis' Nietzsche's Ontology is a bit of a throwback. Although recent years have seen an explosion of scholarship by those working primarily on Nietzsche and historically and philosophically related areas, it was not too long ago that some of the most well-known work in the field was being done by prominent philosophers straying from their dominant areas of research. Addis comes to Nietzsche as an accomplished philosopher and student of the logical positivist Gustav Bergmann, acknowledging at the outset that he is not a Nietzsche scholar. However, he believes that he can make an original contribution to Nietzsche scholarship by applying "the tools of structural history and analytic ontology" (5). As a structural historian, a term borrowed from Bergmann, Addis is looking to formulate an account of what Nietzsche was, "however vaguely and confusedly," trying to say on issues concerning ontology, rather than "what was actually in his mind as he wrote" (127). What Addis produces is a lucid and philosophically substantive analysis of some of the more "sober" aspects of Nietzsche's ontology that nevertheless makes little use of the large body of secondary literature that has appeared since the 1983 publication of Richard Schacht's Nietzsche[1] and does little to make sense of the "wilder" side of Nietzsche's ontology (3, 10, 101, and 133) by situating it within a broader historical context.

After a brief introduction that functions as a preface and includes acknowledgements, Addis begins the second chapter with an account of Nietzsche's views on truth and objectivity, setting out to attack the once common belief that Nietzsche rejected both (7). According to Addis, having an ontology presupposes both truth and objectivity, and since Addis thinks that Nietzsche has an ontology, he concludes that Nietzsche must also be committed to truth and objectivity. Moreover, Addis thinks that everyone must be committed to truth and objectivity simply because we live, and postmodernists who reduce everything to rhetoric and narrative refute themselves every time they refuse to let their children play in the street (9). There are, Addis claims, objective facts, for Nietzsche and for everyone else, that exist independently of our awareness of them.

Moreover, Addis contends that being objective in the quest to know such facts is, for Nietzsche, a goal worth pursuing (17). Although he rightly notes that Nietzsche has much to say about perspectives and interpretations that could be used to dispute his position (18), Addis sees such talk as Nietzsche's attempt to highlight the difficulty of attaining objectivity, not its impossibility (20). Moreover, when Nietzsche seems to be rejecting objectivity, truth, and knowledge, Addis rightly notes that Nietzsche's arguments for these views "rest on a certain ontology" (22). It is to this subject that Addis turns in the remaining five chapters of the book.

Addis devotes the third chapter to the theme of "constant change" and the related distinction between being and becoming (24), and this topic transitions to his discussion, in the fourth chapter, of Nietzsche's putative rejection of substances and things. What is clear, according to Addis, is that Nietzsche rejects being and favors becoming or constant change. Addis' concern, however, is that Nietzsche takes the rejection of being too far. Certainly rejecting being amounts to rejecting timeless entities like Plato's Forms or even God, but Addis resists Nietzsche's belief that this results in an ontology of radical flux and a corresponding rejection of commonsense things (40). Specifically, Addis resists this flux ontology by contending, pace Nietzsche, that the senses actually prove the falsity of constant change, as careful observation of, say, an apple does not reveal any changes as it sits before the observer (39). After speculating that Nietzsche's theory of constant change might rest on the idea of the will to power, Addis concludes the chapter with the claim that the theory of constant change seems to be false: "it is not the case that even at least one empirical, categorical property of every object, for every finite duration, changes" (40).

In the following chapter, Addis argues that although Nietzsche's rejection of substance has some merit, there is "no good reason for denying that there are commonsense continuants and therefore 'things'" (66). According to Addis, Nietzsche needs to distinguish between substances (ontological continuants), which are enduring particulars with no temporal parts, and things (commonsense continuants), which are enduring particulars (with or without temporal parts) (45). Using this distinction, Addis argues that Nietzsche can be committed to both constant change and things. After discussing the related topic of Nietzsche's bundle theory of objects, Addis concludes the fourth chapter by contending that one would be wrong to think, as Nietzsche seems to do, that either constant change or the bundle theory of objects denies the validity of logic or truth. Even if everything is changing or objects are bundles of properties, these facts make the corresponding beliefs true and their negations false (67). So not only is truth preserved with these theories, but also logic and the principle of non-contradiction. However, Addis does agree with Nietzsche that how we categorize things or "how we lay words on the world" is very much a matter of human perception, needs, desires, and values (68).

In the fifth chapter, on "minds," Addis defends the view that Nietzsche is "an anti-substantialist, a dualist, and a parallelist of the epiphenomenalist variety" (73). That Nietzsche is an anti-substantialist comes as no surprise, but Addis notes that Nietzsche's dualism is a less obvious feature of his thought and that he is the first to claim that Nietzsche is a parallelist of the epiphenomenalist variety. In explaining the latter two features of Nietzsche's position, Addis contends that Nietzsche's property dualism is a form of epiphenomenalism because Nietzsche affirms the existence of mental properties or events but denies their efficacy (84). Nietzsche is also a parallelist, according to Addis, because he believes that for every mental state there is a temporally simultaneous and lawfully corresponding physical state that can offer a complete explanation of the mental state (85). However, Addis also argues that Nietzsche does entertain a theory of causation, namely one of lawful connection, that would allow him to be a parallelist though not an epiphenomenalist, but this is something, according to Addis, that Nietzsche failed to recognize (88).

In the next chapter, Addis explicates Nietzsche's theory of causation. After citing his oscillations on the issue, he claims that Nietzsche has a Humean view of causation (101). That is, Nietzsche, like Hume, believes that "we have no experience of an entity that might be called, if it existed, the causal connection of some particular event to some other particular event" (102). Nietzsche, at times, wants to conclude from this that there is no such thing as causation. However, Addis claims that this is a false conclusion: What Nietzsche should deny is not causality as such, but a certain ontological analysis of causation (102). Moreover, Addis rejects the kind of causation that Nietzsche does seem to endorse, namely one that involves a kind of willing (111). Instead, Addis argues that Nietzsche often invokes types of causal explanations that do not involve willing or intending. In fact, given one contemporary understanding of causation and lawfulness (114), Nietzsche seems to subscribe to "a full-blown causal determinism," even though he also seems to deny this in some passages (112). This understanding of causation and lawfulness again derives from Hume, where causation is just lawful connection (115), and lawful connection, according to Addis, is likely nothing more than "regularity, calculability, and inalterability" (116). Thus, Addis concludes, "Nietzsche recognizes the world to be such that, as causation and lawfulness are widely and (in my view) correctly analyzed ontologically, it is a world of causation and lawfulness" (118).

In the final chapter, Addis explores what many would take to be the essence of Nietzsche's ontology, namely the will to power. Addis begins by noting that Nietzsche presents the will to power as a single impulse that is the basic force of everything (122). He comes to this idea by completing the "mechanistic" theory of science, where power becomes an inner event at work within the forces of the scientific picture (123f.). On Addis' account, the will to power leaves us with an ontology of individual quanta of power or energy, "ultimate in the analytic sense of being the simplest entities out of which everything else is constituted or from which in some fashion derived" (127). Before concluding, Addis registers two objections against Nietzsche's theory. First, the will to power, like any theory that tries to explain everything in terms of some undifferentiated entity, cannot tell us why "something happened instead of not happening, as a good explanation does" (129f.). Second, if the will to power is construed, as some passages suggest, as the view that relations are more fundamental than relata, then the will to power is not a defensible thesis. It is, according to Addis, just as absurd as thinking that "substances can exist without accidents (properties)" (131).

Addis concludes the work by noting that he has, in some sense, come full circle (132), and this is perhaps truer than Addis realizes. This is because the becoming-being distinction that kicks off Addis' analysis is just as much about the distinction between relational and non-relational entities as it is about constant change and stability. This is a point that Nietzsche makes clear in his account of Heraclitean becoming in Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks (PTA), a work that Addis strangely ignores. Specifically, Nietzsche claims that Heraclitus rejected both beings and things in the name of becoming and, like Schopenhauer, taught that, "everything which coexists in space and time has but a relative existence, that each thing exists through and for another like it, which is to say through and for an equally relative one" (PTA 5).[2] So understood, Nietzsche's doctrine of becoming entails that there are no entities or simples in space and time that enjoy what Addis calls "ontological independence" (43), and therefore, pace Addis, Nietzsche's doctrine of becoming does commit him to the denial of both substances (ontological continuants) and things (commonsense continuants).

But one might wonder what justification Nietzsche has for thinking that such a relationalist ontology is true? As PTA and his other writings indicate, Nietzsche justifies such a belief by appealing to careful observation of the sensible world and the related results of nineteenth-century science. If we think of becoming in terms of relations, the simple point is that all sensation, which itself is a process or motion, depends on a relation between the perceiver and the perceived, and therefore if one equates all being with what can be perceived, then one will be forced to admit that all being is only relative being. Indeed, this is a point that Gustav Teichmüller makes in Die wirkliche und die scheinbare Welt, the source of Nietzsche's perspectivism.[3] Specifically, Teichmüller claims that all we get in sensation are Beziehungspunkte or points of relation, and what we think are independent things like tables and chairs are really perspectival projections of the knowing subject, which, for Teichmüller but not for Nietzsche, is the only genuine substance and the basis for the appearance-reality distinction.[4]

Nietzsche also believes that the science of his day provides evidence for Heraclitus' ontology. In his early lectures on pre-Platonic philosophy, we are told that the main proposition of the natural sciences is that all things flow.[5] Moreover, the becoming-being distinction takes center stage in the opening section of Human, All Too Human (HH), evidenced by Nietzsche's 1888 reworking of the first aphorism where he associates becoming with a historical philosophy that cannot be separated from the natural sciences.[6] Similarly, in the nineteenth aphorism, we are told that numbers do not correspond to anything in reality because there are no things, and we know there are no things because science has reduced everything thing-like, including the atom, to motions (HH 19). Nietzsche's remarks here are cryptic, but he is likely thinking of F. A. Lange's Geschichte des Materialismus, which explains the way in which developments in the natural sciences have dissolved all matter into relations of force.[7] For Nietzsche, the key figure in Lange's story is Roger Boscovich,[8] whom he credits with eliminating matter so that there is nothing other than force[9] and so teaching us that nothing stands fast (Beyond Good and Evil 12).

So if Nietzsche's view is that everything is relational or that relata are not prior to their relations, how can Nietzsche respond to Addis' charge of absurdity? Here again, Nietzsche's interpretation of pre-Socratic philosophy in PTA is crucial, as he provides a response to such a charge in his account of Parmenides' reaction to Heraclitus' philosophy. What links Addis' charge to Parmenides' criticism of Heraclitus is that they both reject such an ontology on the a priori ground that it is unthinkable (or, for Addis, not "fully intelligible" (130) or "absurd" (131)). Nietzsche, however, thinks that such a charge is a form of logical anthropomorphism, as it depends on an assumed isomorphism between thinking and being, and what the Heraclitean picture challenges is precisely this assumption. For Nietzsche, if the senses and scientific observation reveal a relational world that is unthinkable or contradictory, we should not reject such an ontology for this reason, but simply conclude that there is a disjunction between the structure of the mind and the structure of the world.

It should be obvious from these remarks that, although Addis has provided a lucid and philosophically substantive discussion of Nietzsche's ontology that I think should be given due consideration, he does overlook key features of Nietzsche's ontology by trying to make him much more commonsensical (and a lot less scientific) than he actually is. However, I do want to emphasize that if this assessment is right, the fault lies not in Addis' acuity as a philosopher. Instead, the problem seems to be Addis' role as a "structural historian," an approach that effectively allows him to ignore the historical background to Nietzsche's thought in reconstructing what he thinks Nietzsche's ontology should be. What this means in practice is that Addis uses his own philosophy to judge his Nietzsche throughout the work, so that when Nietzsche takes a view that is clearly outside the parameters of Addis' own system, it is dismissed as "wild"; when Nietzsche offers what is deemed to be a sober view that nevertheless conflicts with Addis' own commitments, it is often disputed before the reasons Nietzsche has for adopting it are fully developed; and when Addis agrees with Nietzsche's position, it is then translated into a language familiar to Addis but foreign to Nietzsche.

As a result, the book turns out to be just as much about Addis' ontology as it is about Nietzsche's. As I see it, if the goal is to provide an account of Nietzsche's ontology, we do better when we strive to read Nietzsche objectively by setting aside our own philosophical positions in generating a historical reconstruction of his thought, and, if the goal is to engage in a philosophical critique of Nietzsche's positions, we do better when we keep in mind not only the background assumptions that shaped his thought, but also our own.

[1] Richard Schacht, Nietzsche, New York: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1983. Although Addis acknowledges that he has profited from a small handful of studies on the topic (5), the only other secondary literature he engages, besides the references to Schacht on some fifteen pages, is the work of Steven Hales and Rex Welshon (3-4 and 56-61) and very briefly that of Peter Poellner (92-93). See Steven D. Hales and Rex Welshon, Nietzsche's Perspectivism, Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2000; and Peter Poellner, Nietzsche and Metaphysics, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995.

[2] Friedrich Nietzsche, Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks, trans. M. Cowan, Washington, DC: Regnery Publishing, 1962.

[3] See Herman Nohl, "Eine historische Quelle zu Nietzsches Perspektivismus: G. Teichmüller, die wirkliche und die scheinbare Welt," in Zeitschrift für Philosophie und Philosophische Kritik 149 (1903): 106-115.

[4] Gustav Teichmüller, Die wirkliche und die scheinbare Welt. Breslau: W. Koebner, 1882.

[5] See Friedrich Nietzsche, The Pre-Platonic Philosophers, trans. G. Whitlock, Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2001, p. 60.

[6] See Friedrich Nietzsche, Kritische Studienausgabe, ed. G. Colli and M. Montinari, Vol. 14, p. 119, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1999.

[7] See Friedrich A. Lange, History of Materialism, trans. E. C. Thomas, New York: The Humanities Press, 1950.

[8] See Roger J. Boscovich, A Theory of Natural Philosophy, trans. J. M. Child, Chicago: Open Court Publishing, 1922.

[9] See Nietzsche's letter to Heinrich Köselitz from 20 March 1882 in Friedrich Nietzsche, Sämtliche Briefe: Kritische Studienausgabe in 8 Bänden, ed. G. Colli and M. Montinari, Vol. 6, p. 183, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1986.