Nietzsche's Thus Spoke Zarathustra: Before Sunrise

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James Luchte (ed.), Nietzsche's Thus Spoke Zarathustra: Before Sunrise, Continuum, 2008, 215pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847062215.

Reviewed by Neil Sinhababu, National University of Singapore


As James Luchte writes in his introduction, Thus Spoke Zarathustra "simultaneously plays in the fields of literature and of philosophy" (1). This is part of why Zarathustra is both delightful to read and difficult to understand. Even as its enchanting images and metaphors draw us in, they often leave us puzzled about its philosophical content. Help in solving its riddles would replace our puzzlement with a better understanding of Nietzsche's philosophy, and give us the greater appreciation that one has for a good riddle when one knows the answer. Some of the essays in this volume help us, either by interpreting difficult passages or by presenting interpretive hypotheses that allow us to make better sense of the text. Those who would like to better understand Zarathustra will gain by reading them.

One general remark is worth making before discussing the individual essays. Some of the authors in the volume infuse their writing with unexplained metaphors from Zarathustra or introduce new metaphors of their own. While it is easy to see how Zarathustra's style gives rise to these temptations, they should be resisted. Part of why we turn to the secondary literature is to better understand the striking images and metaphors in the text. While clear and precise explanations of these images and metaphors are very helpful, using them without explaining them just leaves us where we started. Introducing new metaphors usually just adds an extra level of unclarity. Readers of Zarathustra are already oversupplied with unsolved riddles, and we do not need more. (Scholars should also be counseled against writing in an elevated style reminiscent of the work, as it usually seems like a poor imitation.)

The individual essays vary greatly in style, focus, and quality. I will focus more on them individually rather than giving a general characterization of the volume. Many of the authors furnish their own translations of the passages they cite. When introducing material from Zarathustra, I have used the Kaufmann translation, as I suspect that it is the most familiar to readers of this review.

The first essay is Graham Parkes' "The Symphonic Structure of Thus Spoke Zarathustra: A Preliminary Outline." In several of his letters, Nietzsche refers to Zarathustra as a "symphony" or describes it in other musical terms. Parkes cites these letters and argues that the work is organized like a preclassical symphony. Recognizing this can help us understand why the often disconnected sections of Zarathustra are ordered as they are. Sometimes Parkes' thesis is illuminating -- one can see how "On The Adder's Bite" offers a recapitulation of the themes of justice and punishment from "On The Pale Criminal." Other claims, for example that "On Free Death" recapitulates "On Reading And Writing," are more strained, making one wonder if Nietzsche's musical references in his letters were meant more loosely than Parkes interprets them. Defending such a substantial thesis does not give Parkes much time to work out its philosophical implications or settle interpretive controversies, but if his thesis could be adequately defended it would certainly be useful . In any event, his suggestion that we "read Zarathustra aloud" (28) is an excellent one.

Thomas Brobjer's "Thus Spoke Zarathustra as Nietzsche's Autobiography" argues that the best answer to "who is Nietzsche's Zarathustra?" is that Zarathustra is a sublimated version of Nietzsche. While this thesis might seem banal, Brobjer makes it interesting and helpful by using his considerable biographical knowledge to interpret several passages from Zarathustra as referring to events in Nietzsche's life. Some of his interpretive work makes good sense of bits of the text that are difficult to understand -- for example, the howling dog from "On The Vision And The Riddle" was inspired by a dog that Nietzsche heard at age five when he found his father collapsed. Brobjer also argues that the autobiographical aspect of Zarathustra explains why Nietzsche had such a special regard for it. While this may partly explain why Nietzsche esteemed Zarathustra so highly, I hope that less idiosyncratic features of the work such as its philosophical message and enchanting poetry play a larger role than Brobjer allows.

Yunus Tuncel's "Zarathustra in Nietzsche's Typology" discusses the role of typology in Nietzsche's philosophy, and presents "a reading of Zarathustra as a type within the context of Nietzsche's typology." Tuncel discusses cultural types including the artist and the theoretical man, the character types of the cultural philistine and the free spirit, and historical types from within and beyond the morality of good and evil. These discussions pass quickly from one type to another until arriving at the type of Zarathustra himself. Tuncel's generalities and metaphors keep him from saying much that is false, but also from saying much that is helpful. Claims like "Nietzsche's typology floats within the larger context of his philosophy of values" (49) are too general to help us. The chart of historical types (56), while accurate, tells readers of Zarathustra what we already know. While Tuncel correctly lays out the many types which Zarathustra fits into, his points here and elsewhere in the paper are fairly basic ones that intelligent readers should not require assistance to discover.

In "The Three Metamorphoses and Philosophy," Peter Yates interprets the famous camel-lion-child transition from Part I as going from "propositionalist philosophy," which seeks true propositions on topics like the nature of knowledge, to "ludic philosophy," a more playful way of thought which evaluates cultures and modes of life. Yates interprets the camel's various burdens as difficulties that arise in the course of propositionalist enquiry, including those directly imposed by epistemic values. As the lion, one casts off these burdens, and then emerges, innocent and childlike, into ludic philosophy. While Yates is right that three of the six burdens explicitly involve truth, knowledge, or wisdom, the other three fit only loosely into his schema. The rest of the section does not mention philosophy or epistemic values, suggesting that Nietzsche is concerned with a broad range of values, possibly including epistemic values but also including morality. One might worry that Yates' interpretation would have this section making an unfortunate prediction. Instead of a child, the propositionalists seem to have metamorphosed into a train, replacing infallibilism and classical foundationalism with views like contextualism and externalist epistemology so as to carry their burdens efficiently across desert landscapes.

The second set of essays deals with the eternal recurrence, and begins with Friedrich Ulfers and Mark Daniel Cohen's "Zarathustra, the Moment, and Eternal Recurrence of the Same: Nietzsche's Ontology of Time." Ulfers and Cohen discuss scientific views of Nietzsche's era which supported belief in the eternal recurrence. For instance, Nietzsche extensively read the work of Robert Mayer, who thought energy was conserved without increases in entropy over time, allowing states of the universe to repeat themselves. Ulfers and Cohen claim that Nietzsche knew of Riemannian geometry and its implications for cosmology, though one section of The Will to Power provides their best evidence that he accepted it and incorporated it into his thought. They argue that the phrase "eternal recurrence of the same" is not contradictory, a conclusion that seems too obvious to deserve an argument as ingenious as theirs. Sometimes they say strange things about lines. The view that "time runs infinitely in a straight line" is called "the normative conception of time" (83). What is normative about infinite straight lines? Nevertheless, readers willing to look past issues like this will find useful information in this essay.

Paul Loeb's "The Gateway-Augenblick" presents a detailed discussion of "On The Vision And The Riddle," the first section of Zarathustra with a clear presentation of the eternal recurrence. Loeb's interpretation connects this section to Plato's Phaedo via Gay Science 340, the section immediately preceding the discussion of the eternal recurrence in that book, with the dwarf who represents the "spirit of gravity" as a Socratic figure and the gateway as the moment of death. This section of Zarathustra poses a number of difficult puzzles, including the question of why Zarathustra so angrily responds to the dwarf's comment that time is a circle. As many other parts of the text present the eternal recurrence in terms of circular time, Loeb seems right to disagree with many other interpreters who think that Zarathustra rejects the circularity of time. While it would be surprising if an interpretation as bold and intricate as Loeb's met with total agreement from anyone, his detailed attention to the text and his sense for where interpretive controversies need to be addressed make this essay one of the high points of the volume. Anyone interested in the eternal recurrence will profit from reading it.

The final essay in the section is Alan Wenham's "Thus Spoke Zarathustra: The Hammer and the Greatest Weight." Wenham describes Nietzsche's critique of traditional philosophy, and then interprets Zarathustra's horror at the abysmal thought of the eternal recurrence as his realization that even his philosophy and his goal of creating the Overman are trapped within the "slave hermeneutic of time" (123). Wenham does not engage deeply with the text, and his interpretation seems to be based more on the idea that Nietzsche is like Hegel than on evidence from Nietzsche's writings. Of the striking images from "On Redemption," the section of Zarathustra most crucial to his interpretation, he says nothing. Little of the dream in the prior section is explained by interpreting it as Zarathustra's premonition that he is trapped within the slave hermeneutic, and it is hard to see why this realization does not affect his goals. It is also unclear how to fit Wenham's interpretation with later discussions of the eternal recurrence. For all we know, he did not notice these issues. It is a shame that he was made to write about Zarathustra; he clearly wanted to write about something else.

Coming when it did, the beginning of Gudrun von Tevenar's "Zarathustra on Freedom" -- "In this chapter, I will stay exclusively within the text of Thus Spoke Zarathustra" -- was very refreshing. She distinguishes the two kinds of freedom that are mentioned in "On The Way Of The Creator," where Zarathustra says "Free from what? As if that mattered to Zarathustra! But your eyes should tell me brightly: free for what?" Von Tevenar argues that Nietzsche regards the former kind of freedom only as a necessary precondition for the latter kind which is truly valuable and must arise from within the agent. While she sometimes uses metaphors from Zarathustra without explaining them sufficiently, she accurately describes an area of considerable practical significance within Nietzsche's philosophy without excessive technical jargon. Von Tevenar also follows some underappreciated symbols that recur at several points in the text, such as ashes and wild dogs, and her work enriches our understanding of the sections in which these appear.

Arno Boehler's "Nietzsche -- On the Regenerative Character of Dispositions" could have been placed in the section of the book on the eternal recurrence. It mostly concerns Zarathustra's recovery in "The Convalescent" and sections near it, discussing the role of music in some depth. Boehler uses many Nietzschean metaphors without explaining them and occasionally employs some of his own, which makes it difficult to use his essay for understanding Zarathustra. For example, he writes that

For Zarathustra's complete recovery, in which the strings of his soul are brought back to life and song, he does not just need new songs but also a new lyre, providing his soul with new chambers, sensitive organs, and exquisite sensors, which will allow him to feel in new and different ways. (144)

I would be interested in learning how one's soul can change in these ways, and what sorts of new sensory capabilities and ways of feeling are involved, but Boehler does not explain this. Still, his discussion of Zarathustra's conversation with his animals about the eternal recurrence (145-146) is helpful. Boehler is much more sensitive to the way the convalescent Zarathustra and his animals understand each other than many other interpreters have been.

The next essay is "In Search of the Wellsprings of the Future and of New Origins" by Uschi Nussbaumer-Benz. It claims that Nietzsche was inspired by an ancient Pali text, the Dighanikaya, which points us towards a foundation for a world culture less riven by religious strife. Nussbaumer-Benz discusses the photograph Nietzsche arranged in which he and Paul Ree take the pose of oxen pulling a cart while Lou Salome stands upon it with a whip, and compares it to a scene from the Dighanikaya in which a young noblewoman drives her wagon so as to best a group of ascetic noblemen. Readers more familiar with the Dighanikaya than myself might see deeper similarities between the ancient scene and the photograph. Nussbaumer-Benz argues that Nietzsche was familiar with this scene and that it expresses values which would let us avoid the conflicts that arise between messianic religions, occasionally referencing Zarathustra in a stream-of-consciousness fashion that skips unpredictably from topic to topic. Those who would like a break from discussing Nietzsche's philosophy may appreciate this essay.

The final essay in the collection is Vanessa Lemm's "Justice and Gift-Giving in Thus Spoke Zarathustra." Lemm says Nietzsche thinks "justice is a gift-giving virtue and, conversely, that gift-giving is justice" (165). This should charitably be read not as a necessary truth about gift-giving or justice, but rather as presenting affinities between the kind of justice Nietzsche praises and the kind of gift-giving he regards most highly. Much of the essay examines the gift-giving virtue with reference to gold in Zarathustra. This is a worthwhile approach, as gold has a symbolic connection with gift-giving throughout the text. The accessible presentation of Derrida's views on gift-giving is welcome. (Derrida's view that there can be "no gift without forgetfulness" (168), which plays a major role in the essay, seems too strong -- a gift-giver should not care to keep score, but surely this can be achieved without forgetting.) Lemm is sometimes less accurate in her presentation of other views. It will come as news to Peter Singer that "according to utilitarian principles, gift-giving is mad because it suspends the instinct of self-preservation" (176). Her claims that the gift-giving virtue is an animal virtue and that there is an "intimate connection between an agonistic friendship with the animals and the attainment of virtue in general" (167) are absurd but delightful.