Nietzsche Versus Paul

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Abed Azzam, Nietzsche Versus Paul, Columbia University Press, 2015, 209pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231169318.

Reviewed by Matthew Meyer, The University of Scranton


This is a dense book. Abed Azzam's main contention seems to be that Nietzsche's thought is structured just as much (if not more) as a response to Pauline Christianity as it is to Plato and Platonic philosophy. So Heidegger and Deleuze, readers who place Nietzsche in conversation primarily with Plato and the philosophical tradition, have missed something about what Azzam calls the "essential-Nietzsche." To make his case, Azzam provides an account of what he calls a "Nietzschean history of Christianity" in the book's six chapters, beginning with Dionysian tragedy and concluding with an account of Modernity. Although the book draws attention to an important aspect of Nietzsche's work that is often overlooked and gets some of the "essential-Nietzsche" right, the density of the prose will frustrate some readers, and questionable steps in Azzam's argument will leave even those sympathetic to his style skeptical of some of his more ambitious claims.

That the book is a challenging read is evidenced by Azzam's first characterization of it. In the first paragraph, he claims that, "Nietzsche Versus Paul is a study of the Christian embrace of Nietzsche's sought-after truth that ends in its obliteration" (xiii). Although that makes clear that Christianity plays an important role in the book, this statement does little to make clear what the book is about. One obvious problem with the statement is the ambiguity of the antecedent for the pronoun "its." Will Nietzsche Versus Paul end in its obliteration? Or is it the Christian embrace? Or perhaps Nietzsche's sought after truth? My guess is the latter, but I nevertheless have to guess, and this sort of ambiguity forces the reader to pause to figure out the meaning of what should be a straightforward characterization. These sorts of ambiguities run throughout the text.

A similar lack of clarity can be found in Azzam's articulation of his central thesis and his attempt to explain how his reading differs from that of Heidegger's and Deleuze's anti-Platonic readings. For instance, he claims in the opening paragraph that he will explain, "how the knowledge of the essential-Nietzsche . . . is impossible" (xiii). On the subsequent page, he then argues that both Heidegger and Deleuze agree that, "an essential-Nietzsche ought to be sought" (xiv). Although one might expect Azzam, in turn, to chide Heidegger and Deleuze for seeking an essential-Nietzsche that is impossible to find, he instead claims that he will engage in the project of correcting their understanding of the essential-Nietzsche. According to Azzam, "the task of unearthing the essential-Nietzsche should take the anti-Christian Nietzsche -- rather than the anti-Platonic one -- as its central concern" (xv). So whereas Azzam begins by denying the possibility of finding an essential-Nietzsche, he nevertheless sets for himself the task of unearthing an improved understanding of the essential-Nietzsche.

In pursuing this task, it is not always clear just how strong Azzam wants to make his central thesis. A weak reading of it, which I will call the supplemental thesis, says that Heidegger's and Deleuze's anti-Platonic readings have overlooked the importance of Christianity for Nietzsche's project, and so the task at hand is simply to supplement their accounts of the essential-Nietzsche. Although this supplemental thesis is what I think is demonstrated in the book, Azzam seems to defend even stronger claims. On the one hand, he seems to defend what I will call a priority thesis. The priority thesis states that both the anti-Platonic and the anti-Christian are central aspects of the essential-Nietzsche, but the latter is more important than the former. On the other hand, Azzam's language occasionally suggests an even stronger view, which I will call the subsumption thesis. On this view, the anti-Platonic Nietzsche is subsumed by an account of Nietzsche's engagement with Christianity, such that Nietzsche's engagement with Plato is merely one aspect of his larger understanding of and confrontation with Christianity.

Part of the reason for thinking that Azzam pursues the subsumption thesis is that he begins the first chapter by constructing what he calls "the Nietzschean history of Christianity" (1), the starting point of which is "ancient Greek religion" (2) and so includes an account of Dionysian tragedy. Most readers will be struck by the oddity of Azzam's claim that the history of Christianity begins prior to Christianity. However, this can be explained by the fact that Azzam equates the history of Christianity with what he also calls a history of pessimism, and he understands the history of pessimism as "the history of the answers given to the question of the value of life from the point of view of the problem of suffering" (4). So understood, including Dionysian religion and tragedy within an account of what Azzam calls a Nietzschean history of Christianity makes perfect sense. The question is whether this is an appropriate definition of a Nietzschean history of Christianity and so whether ancient Greece, from Dionysian tragedy to the rise of Platonic philosophy, can be placed within such a history.

The problem is that there is reason to think that the history of Christianity is not the same as the history of pessimism, and this is because Christianity itself does not present various answers -- note the plural -- to the question of the value of life in response to the problem of suffering. Instead, Christianity is just one possible answer among competing answers -- such as Greek tragedy and Schopenhauer's Buddhism -- to this question. Because the history of pessimism is broader than the history of Christianity, it is wrong to equate the history of Christianity with the history of pessimism, and so alternative answers to the pessimistic problem of the value of life cannot be subsumed under a history of Christianity. As I explain below, this is the primary reason I do not think that Azzam succeeds in defending the subsumption thesis.

Despite these difficulties, I will do my best to give a brief account of Azzam's argument in the main chapters. He breaks down the Nietzschean history of Christianity into three components, which seem to provide the structure for the six chapters. The first part of this history is a Greek pre-Christian history, discussed in chapter one, and a Jewish pre-Christian history, discussed in chapter two, both of which lead to Christianity. Second, there is Christianity itself, which Azzam treats in chapter three, "Jesus-Christ and the Two Worlds of Early Christianity," and chapter four, "Paul: The First Christian." The final two chapters, "Science and Art After the Death of God" and "Beyond Modern Temporality," give an account of "post-Christian history, or Modernity, as a conclusion of Christianity" (4).

The purpose of the first two chapters is to discuss the origins of Christianity in Greek and Jewish culture and to show how the decay of these two cultures paved the way for the emergence of Christianity. The three parts of the first chapter cover Dionysian tragedy, the problem of Socrates, and Plato's pre-Christian Christianity. In ancient Greek religion and so Dionysian tragedy, an affirmative answer is given to the question of the value of life (3). According to Azzam, Socrates represents a turning point from Dionysian tragedy to Plato's Christianity insofar as "Socrates is the place in which a new meaning of suffering, as an alternative to the tragic one, is made possible" (11). In Plato, we then find a common ground with Christianity in that both present "the possibility of overcoming this-world's suffering in the other-world's salvation" (19).

After giving a similar developmental account of the movement from Judaism to Christianity in chapter two by way of an engagement with arguments largely, but not exclusively, from On the Genealogy of Morals, Azzam turns to an account of Christianity in chapters three and four. Interesting here is his explanation of the relationship between Pyrrhonian skepticism and the emergence of Christianity. In contrast to some recent scholarship that casts Nietzsche as a Pyrrhonian skeptic, Azzam argues that, "For Nietzsche, the decadence of Greek philosophy, which starts with Socrates, reaches its high point in the Buddhism of Pyrrho" (59). Nevertheless, Azzam's Nietzsche sees the development of Pyrrhonian skepticism as Buddhism as a necessary step in the history of Christianity, and just as Pyrrho is a Buddhist on Greek soil, Azzam claims that Nietzsche understands Jesus as a Buddhist on Jewish soil (66). As such, both prepared the way for the emergence of Christianity as a demand of faith.

In Chapter four Azzam argues that Nietzsche's genealogical method shows the Christian faith to be what he calls an unauthentic lie (97). This is in contrast to an authentic lie: "the lie that does not produce the illusion of the other world that becomes, as illusion, the negating alternative of this-world" (95). The genealogical method does this by revealing the way in which the supposed simplicity of the Christian faith actually conceals a plurality of otherness (97-98). At the same time, Azzam identifies limits to Nietzsche's genealogy. Although Nietzsche's attempted return to the Dionysian undermines slave-morality as our only moral perspective, Nietzsche tries to posit the Dionysian, which Azzam associates with noble-morality (87), as an origin that transcends historical dialectics and so, in Azzam's words, "protects the Dionysian Antichrist from the destructive impact of the realization of the teleology of the instrumentality of reason in genealogical consciousness" (103). For this reason, Azzam questions the legitimization of the Dionysian as origin (xix).

In chapter five Azzam addresses some standard topics in Nietzsche scholarship: the death of God, modern science, and modern art. On the one hand, he identifies a discontinuity between Christianity and Modernity insofar as God has been declared dead (107). On the other hand, he argues that, for Nietzsche, Modernity is continuous with Christianity insofar as it is still vanquishing God's shadow (108). This process of completing the project of Modernity takes place insofar as the scientific will to truth is revealed as a faith, but a faith that is, according to Azzam, a "nonauthentic lie" (117). This is because modern science "does not own an independent faith" (118). Instead, it is subject to some ideal beyond itself. Furthermore, modern science is unable to provide meaning to the suffering it conceals. This is why modern science needs to complete the project of atheism by subjecting itself to art; this claim is the subject of the final section.

In the final chapter, Azzam continues to develop the theme of Nietzsche's relationship to Paul by expanding on an argument that he first broached in chapter four. There, Azzam claims that Paul is an exemplar for Nietzsche (85) in that they share a "dialectical resemblance," a term which Azzam appropriates from Jörg Salaquarda (xvii), even though he disagrees with Salaquarda on the nature of this resemblance (89). Azzam develops this resemblance by casting Modernity, and in particular the German Hegel (140), as Nietzsche's Katechon. Katechon is a term from Pauline theology, and it is that which delays the coming of the Antichrist (137). As Nietzsche's Katechon, Modernity is the failed attempt to overcome and preserve Christianity. Because it fails to overcome Christianity, Modernity is actually what Azzam calls a "preservation-without-overcoming of Christianity" (141) and so a delayer of the coming of the Antichrist. As the Antichrist, Nietzsche's project represents "the overcoming-without-preservation of Christianity" (142), and, according to Azzam, Nietzsche ultimately hopes that the history of Christianity will be overcome with the emergence of the overman (145).

In the final section, Azzam returns to his understanding of the history of Christianity, summarizes Nietzsche's "dialectical resemblance" to Paul, and discusses how his reading compares to those of Heidegger, Deleuze, and Karl Löwith. First, Azzam claims that because Nietzsche's history of Christianity includes three parts -- the (pre-Christian) Dionysian, the (Priestly Jewish Christian) Christ, and modern self-preservation -- Nietzsche's thinking can be located "in the bosom of Pauline theology, insofar as these three parts match its triangle consisting of Christ, the Antichrist, and the Katechon" (145-146). Second, because Nietzsche's thinking reveals a dialectical resemblance to Paul in a number of respects, Azzam argues that the significance of the Dionysian and so the ancient Greek tradition in Nietzsche's thought "does not seem to be able to transcend its Christian structure" (146). As a result, Azzam's focus on Nietzsche's engagement with Pauline Christianity displaces Heidegger and Deleuze's emphasis on Platonic philosophy (Athens) for understanding Nietzsche, and this leads Azzam to conclude that, in contrast to Löwith, "Nietzsche's atheism is Christian and not Greek" (150).

What this final section indicates is that Azzam is indeed defending what I have called the subsumption thesis by placing Nietzsche's relationship to antiquity within a Pauline structure. The problem with this argument is that it presupposes that the history of Christianity is equivalent to a history of pessimism, and there is reason to think that this equation is illegitimate. Furthermore, even if Azzam's Nietzschean history of Christianity were renamed a history of pessimism or a history of attempts to answer the "question of the value of life from the point of view of the problem of suffering" (4), it would still be necessary to confront the largely unacknowledged "other" of pessimism in Azzam's account, namely, optimism. Optimism is the view that genuine happiness is possible and that life is inherently valuable because suffering is not essential to life, and so the task for the optimist is not to give meaning to suffering but to find ways to reduce it. So understood, it could be argued that optimists such as Socrates, Plato, and Hegel did not offer responses to the problem of suffering and so argue that they fall outside a history of pessimism. However, Azzam does endeavor to show that optimistic thinkers like Socrates were, in fact, providing responses to the problem of suffering, even if only subconsciously (9), and so a good argument can be made that even optimism should be included within a history of pessimism.

In any case, I think it is clear that Azzam's subsumption thesis fails insofar as it is construed in terms of Pauline Christianity, while the success of the thesis is debatable when translated into a history of pessimism. And although Azzam is certainly right to stress the importance of Paul for Nietzsche's thought, I do not think that the primacy thesis holds across Nietzsche's oeuvre. Instead, there is reason to think that Nietzsche is just as interested in countering Plato as he is in countering Paul and that Nietzsche's attention shifts from one figure to the other as his works unfold. So although Nietzsche clearly directs his attention toward Pauline Christianity as he engages in a project of a revaluation of values in his final works, there is little doubt that Plato, not Paul, is the primary target of a work like Beyond Good and Evil (BGE). This is indicated not only by Nietzsche's explicit rejection of Plato's concept of the pure spirit and good as such at the beginning of the work (BGE Pref) but also by the fact that Nietzsche's portrayal of Dionysus as a god who philosophizes at the end of the work is clearly aimed at correcting Plato's understanding of eros in the Symposium (BGE 295) even if the portrayal of Dionysus as the genius of the heart is opposed to Jesus as a knower of the heart in BGE 269 and so prefigures the opposition between Dionysus and the Crucified announced at the end of Ecce Homo.

Nevertheless, it should be said in closing that Azzam has performed the important task of furthering a line of scholarship that emphasizes the significance of Paul for understanding Nietzsche's project, and he does adequately defend what I have called the supplemental thesis. Given the recent interest in Paul among continental philosophers,[1] Azzam's book, despite its argumentative flaws and the density of its prose, will be welcomed by those interested in the philosophical significance of Paul as a timely contribution that makes Nietzsche a central figure in this discussion.

[1] See, for instance, Ward Blanton and Hent de Vries (eds.), Paul and the Philosophers (New York, NY: Fordham University Press, 2013).