Nietzsche's Constructivism: A Metaphysics of Material Objects

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Justin Remhof, Nietzsche's Constructivism: A Metaphysics of Material Objects, Routledge, 2018, 175 pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138221567.

Reviewed by Matthew Meyer, University of Scranton


Do ordinary tables and chairs really exist? This will seem like a silly question to many, but a number of contemporary philosophers are taking this question quite seriously. Arguments against the existence of ordinary objects have ranged "from naturalist inclinations to accept only the ontology yielded by our best physical theories to pure a priori arguments based on apparent contradictions in our ordinary concepts."[1] In response to these arguments, philosophers such as Amie Thomasson and Daniel Korman have taken on the task of making reflective sense of "our unreflective common sense worldview"[2] to assure us that "things are more or less the way they seem" with regard to ordinary objects.[3]

Justin Remhof sets out to show that Friedrich Nietzsche can make a unique contribution to this discussion. On the one hand, Remhof's Nietzsche agrees with the commonsense realist that ordinary objects exist. On the other hand, he rejects the commonsense realist's claim that such objects exist independently of our possible representations of them. Instead, Remhof's Nietzsche holds that ordinary objects are socially constructed and so brought into existence by human practices. The idea that ordinary objects are both constructed and real is the essence of what Remhof calls Nietzsche's constructivism (1).

Remhof's book consists of eight chapters that focus on different aspects of Nietzsche's constructivism and its relationship to contemporary philosophy. Chapters two, three, and four constitute the real center of the book. In these chapters, Remhof defends his constructivist reading of Nietzsche against alternatives in the secondary literature. Chapters two and four look at textual and philosophical challenges to the constructivist reading, while chapter three unpacks the textual evidence in favor of constructivism. In the final four chapters, Remhof proceeds to discuss the consequences of constructivism within the context of Nietzsche's works (chapters five and six) and its potential relationship to subsequent philosophy (chapters seven and eight).

Remhof's work is an important contribution to Nietzsche studies. It is the first work that focuses exclusively on Nietzsche's understanding of material objects and lays out, in systematic fashion, the different views on this topic dispersed throughout the secondary literature. In chapter two, Remhof presents the best evidence for alternatives to his constructivist reading and then argues that, "Nietzsche rejects them all" (17). Here, he considers three alternatives: (1) a commonsense realist reading, (2) an eliminativism that denies the existence of objects and subjects, and (3) what he calls unificationism, or the view that objects exist as "intrinsically unified bundles of forces" (39).

According to Remhof, the commonsense realist reading of Nietzsche is defended primarily by Maudemarie Clark and Brian Leiter. It holds that "objects are ordinary entities that exist independently of our representations of them" (20). Remhof rejects this reading for two reasons. First, it conflicts with the evidence that supports his constructivist reading. Second, Remhof claims that there is no textual support for such a view. Even though there are passages in which Nietzsche seems to assume the existence of ordinary objects (21), Remhof writes that he "finds no passage in which Nietzsche claims that objects exist ontologically independent of our practices," and this is why readers committed to the commonsense realist interpretation "never point to any such passages" (24).

Although I think Remhof is right to reject the commonsense reading, Clark and Leiter would likely respond to these criticisms by emphasizing two points. First, much -- but certainly not all! -- of the evidence Remhof uses in chapter three to support his constructivist reading is taken from the Nachlass, and Clark and Leiter would be quick to discount the significance of such evidence on the grounds that Nietzsche never thought it fit for publication. Second, although Remhof seems to be right in claiming that Nietzsche never explicitly states that objects exist independently of our practices, Clark and Leiter would likely argue that Nietzsche's perspectivism, based on a careful reading of a passage from the third essay of On the Genealogy of Morality (GM III 12), implies the existence of commonsense objects.

At the end of the second chapter, Remhof turns to unificationism. Unificationism is a realist position in which ordinary objects are re-described in the language of force that Nietzsche inherits from the natural sciences. Remhof rejects the unificationist reading for two related reasons. First, he thinks that there is substantial textual evidence indicating that interpretation and subjectivity are essential to the qualities things possess (see KSA 12, 9[40]).[4] If this is right, the identity conditions of objects are, pace the unificationist reading, dependent on our interpretations (41), and since identity conditions are necessary for there to be objects, there can be no objects independently of subjectivity and interpretation. Second, Nietzsche often claims that bundles of forces are constituted by their contextual relations with all other bundles. If this is right, then the unificationist's claim that objects are intrinsically unified bundles of forces must be wrong (42).

There is, however, a close relationship between unificationism and Remhof's constructivism, and he begins his defense of constructivism in chapter three by building on an argument that he initially presents in favor of unificationism. The key premise in the argument for constructivism -- one not present in the argument for unificationism -- is that objects, as unified bundles of forces, are unified "by virtue of human practices," and this premise leads to the constructivist's conclusion that "human practices bring all objects into existence" (49). According to Remhof, human practices bring objects into existence by providing the identity conditions, i.e., conditions that determine what a given object is, that are necessary for objects to exist at all (19).

Even though he claims that his project primarily "concerns macroscopic objects," Remhof speculates in section 3.2 about what he calls "universal constructivism" or the view that all objects, including microscopic forces, are constructed (55). His argument, however, falters in at least two respects. First, he does not distinguish between forces simpliciter and forces construed either as separable "force-points" (as the mathematical physicists do) or as wills-to-power (as Nietzsche does), and this conflation allows him to argue that forces simpliciter are constructs by appealing to textual evidence in which Nietzsche claims that force-points (KSA 11, 40[36]) and wills-to-power (KSA 13, 14[186]) are constructs. Nietzsche's position, however, seems to be that both force-points and wills-to-power are interpretations of non-mathematical forces that otherwise lack an inner quality and directedness (KSA 11, 36[31]). Second, if we agree with Remhof that forces are constructs, then either everything is constructed (idealism) or there is a mind-independent something from which both microscopic forces and macroscopic objects are constructed. Here, Remhof picks the latter of these two unsavory options, claiming that objects are constructed from a mere something that is nevertheless not an object (61).

Because this mere something sounds a lot like Locke's much criticized we-know-not-what conception of substance or even Aristotle's prime matter, I think Remhof is better off retreating to the position he takes in section 3.1, that forces function as the unconstructed reality from which macroscopic objects are constructed. But if this is right, Remhof still faces the challenge of showing that these constructed objects are just as much real as the unconstructed forces that provide the raw materials for object construction. One reason for thinking that such objects lack what Remhof calls "genuine existence" (5) is that Nietzsche sometimes refers to constructed objects as "regulative fictions" (KSA 11, 35[35]). Another reason is that Nietzsche seems to adopt the idea that we find genuine existence or reality by stripping away whatever we contribute to it. In doing this, we do not find things or even things-in-themselves, but rather "motions" (Human, All-Too-Human 19), "chaos" (The Gay Science 109), "dynamic quanta, in relation of tension to all other dynamic quanta" (KSA 13, 14[79]), "a world of relationships" (KSA 13, 14[93]), and "nothing else other than force" (KSB 6, 213).[5]

Such passages also provide evidence for eliminativism, and I think eliminativism poses the most formidable challenge to Remhof's constructivism. To begin, there is a lot of evidence for eliminativism that Remhof does not address in chapter two. This is because he counts both the published and unpublished works starting with Human, All-Too-Human (1878) as evidence, and so seems to owe an explanation as to why, for instance, an 1881 Nachlass note, in which Nietzsche claims that consciousness falsifies a world of flux by creating persistent individuals, does not count in favor of the eliminativist position (KSA 9, 11[162]). Remhof's answer will likely be that he is only responding to the best evidence (17), and so he does not need to deal with every passage that supports eliminativism. But even here he seems to fall short. This is because he acknowledges in his introduction that "Nietzsche asserts that objects do not exist" in aphorism 19 of Human, All Too Human (2), but we never learn -- even though he discusses the aphorism elsewhere (45n21) -- why this passage does not support the eliminativist reading.

In contrast, Remhof does provide a detailed analysis of a similar passage from The Gay Science (GS) in which Nietzsche claims that beliefs in "things, substances, bodies" are "erroneous articles of faith" (GS 110). Here, Remhof argues that the passage does not reject the existence of objects altogether, but only material objects (31-32). Part of his argument rests on situating GS 110 in the larger context of The Gay Science, and Remhof points to passages such as GS 58, in which we are told that we "create new 'things'" by creating new names (GS 58), to argue that Nietzsche embraces constructivism, rather than eliminativism, in the work. One problem with Remhof's reading of GS 58 -- and this is true of other passages as well (KSA 12, 9[44] (see p. 48) and KSA 13, 14[98] (see p. 6)) -- is that Nietzsche places both "'things'" and "'reality'" in scare quotes, and if scare quotes are used to shed doubt on the reality of the phenomenon under discussion, then GS 58 suggests that the 'things' or 'reality' we construct lack genuine existence.

There are similar problems with Remhof's treatment of what he calls subject eliminativism. As Remhof presents it, subject eliminativism is both another form of eliminativism (it denies the existence of subjects) and an argument for object eliminativism (there are no objects because there are no subjects). Remhof argues against subject eliminativism, in part, by claiming that, although Nietzsche rejects subjects as substances, Nietzsche nevertheless believes that subjects exist as constructs. One problem for Remhof is that the passage he uses to support this view is the very passage in which Nietzsche also claims that the constructed subject -- just like "'matter,' 'thing,' 'substance,' 'individual,' 'purpose,' 'number'" -- is a "regulative fiction" (KSA 11, 35[35]). Here again, this suggests that both subjects and objects lack genuine existence, and so Nietzsche's claims about the way in which subjects and objects are constructed go hand in hand with an eliminativism that denies the genuine existence of such entities.

Another problem with Remhof's argument is that the claim that objects are projections of a knowing subject can be traced back to the source for Nietzsche's use of the term "perspectivism," Gustav Teichmüller's The Real and Apparent World. There, Teichmüller argues that the unity essential to commonsense things is simply a projection of the knowing subject and so things such as "this stone," "this tree," "this hand" -- these are Teichmüller's examples -- are merely "perspectival image[s]."[6] Although Teichmüller provides evidence for attributing a version of constructivism to Nietzsche, his account differs from Remhof's in two important respects. First, Teichmüller holds that we construct objects by bundling together perceiver-dependent sensations rather than perceiver-independent forces. Second, Teichmüller refers to these constructed objects as perspectival images because each perceiver creates a different perspectival image from a different set of subjective sensations.

Such reflections point to a philosophical problem with Remhof's reading. To see the problem, let's agree with Remhof that human practices unite inter-subjectively available bundles of forces (rather than subjective sensations) by generating identity conditions. This seems to work if everyone agrees on what a given bundle of forces should be. But what happens in cases of disagreement? Here, it seems that one and the same bundle of forces could be defined differently, and so one and the same bundle of forces could be two different objects at one and the same time.

Remhof is aware of this problem, and his answer comes in two parts. First, he argues that such disagreement cannot happen between individuals. According to Remhof's Nietzsche, objects are "socially constructed" because language and consciousness emerged with the need to communicate (50). But even if we agree that objects must be socially constructed (and I think there are reasons to resist this claim), it is still possible that different groups will construct objects differently, and so it seems that two different groups could impose two conflicting interpretations on one and the same bundle of forces. As I understand it, Remhof's answer to a version of this problem -- provided in the section "Construction and Contradiction" from chapter four -- relies largely on his claim -- provided in the section "Constraints and Conceptualization" from chapter three -- that conceptually structured sensory information places constraints on how we construct objects (65), and so, in cases of conflict, it might be that only one group is correct (78). Although he does think that basic sense perceptions place constraints on interpretation, Nietzsche also seems to embrace the idea that there can be two or more conflicting interpretations of one and the same thing or "text" (Beyond Good and Evil 22 and GS 374), and if this is possible, then it still seems possible for one and the same bundle of forces to be two things at once.

There are other potential objections to Nietzsche's constructivism, such as the problem of unperceived objects and the charge of circularity, and Remhof devotes chapter four to dealing with these. In chapter five, Remhof tries to revive the idea that Nietzsche is a pragmatist about truth, and he does so by claiming that truth and usefulness come together for Nietzsche because our needs create the conditions, i.e., the property-instantiating objects, that make propositions true or false. To be sure, there are Nachlass passages in which Nietzsche claims that truth is made. However, in one of the passages he cites, Remhof omits, both in the English and the German, the scare-quotes around "truth" in the original (KSA 12, 9[91] (see p. 91); he also does this in referring to "reality" in KSA 12, 9[97] (see p. 57)). Although Remhof might argue that these scare quotes mean that Nietzsche wants us to think of truth and reality in a new way, i.e., as constructed, Nietzsche again seems to be implying that these 'truths' lack genuine existence. If we combine this idea with what many -- although Remhof offers an alternative reading (94-95) -- have taken to be Nietzsche's anti-pragmatist claim that "untruth is a condition of life" at the beginning of Beyond Good and Evil (BGE 4), we can say that Nietzsche is a pragmatist about created 'truths' that are nevertheless "untruths" in the sense that they fail to correspond to the world of force described by science.

In chapter six, Remhof argues that constructivism helps Nietzsche develop a life-affirming solution to the problem of nihilism by overcoming the longing for a mind-independent or "true" world (119) and embracing the idea that our activities can transform the empirical world (126). In the final section of the chapter, he rightly claims that there is an intimate association between constructivism and art. Just as "the artistic method organizes what is not organized prior to our practices," Remhof claims that constructivism "holds that we create determinate form by organizing sensory information" (124). However, he acknowledges that Nietzsche often associates art with lies and falsification (124) (even though he tempers Nietzsche's claims that concepts falsify reality in section 4.2). Therefore, if the construction of objects is like the artistic method, then there are again reasons for thinking that the construction of objects is also a case of creating life-affirming lies or fictions rather than objects that have "genuine existence."

In the final two chapters, Remhof situates Nietzsche's constructivism in relation to recent philosophy. In chapter seven, he investigates potential connections between Nietzsche and William James, Nelson Goodman, and Richard Rorty, ultimately arguing that Nietzsche is most like James. In the final chapter, Remhof reveals that Nietzsche's constructivism has a conservative upshot that is, in my mind, reminiscent of Berkeley. What makes this position conservative -- and Remhof uses this appellation in relation to contemporary debates -- is that it holds that commonsense objects, and only commonsense objects, exist, and this contrasts with counterintuitive views such as eliminativism, which denies the existence of ordinary objects, and permissivism, which allows for the existence of composite entities such as a treebird made from ordinary objects like tree and bird (144). What makes this position like Berkeley's is that we win back the commonsense world -- this was one of Berkeley's selling points -- but do so only by making the existence of material objects depend on the cognition of subjects (20).

Although my criticisms are many, Remhof has done an admirable job of laying out the scholarly terrain and offering a unique contribution that those working on Nietzsche should take seriously. In my view, he has shown that constructivism is a superior alternative to both the commonsense realist and unificationist readings, and so the real question is whether Nietzsche thinks that the objects we construct have genuine existence or whether they are pragmatic fictions that falsify the scientific, and so real, world of force. I have given a number of reasons why I think the latter is the case, but this book may persuade others that Nietzsche is a constructivist in Remhof's sense.

My thanks to Brian Leiter, Paul Loeb, and Justin Remhof for comments on an earlier draft of this review.

[1] Amie Thomassson, Ordinary Objects (Oxford University Press, 2007), 4.

[2] Ibid, 1.

[3] Daniel Korman, Objects: Nothing Out of the Ordinary (Oxford University Press, 2015), 1.

[4] KSA = Friedrich Nietzsche: Sämtliche Werke, Kritische Studien Ausgabe, ed. G. Colli and M. Montinari (De Gruyter, 1999). Cited by volume and note number.

[5] KSB = Friedrich Nietzsche: Sämtliche Briefe, Kritische Studienausgabe, ed. G. Colli and M. Montinari (De Gruyter, 1986). Cited by volume and letter number.

[6] Gustav Teichmuller, Die wirkliche und die scheinbare Welt (Wilhelm Koebner, 1882), 333.