Nietzsche's Culture of Humanity: Beyond Aristocracy and Democracy in the Early Period

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Jeffrey Church, Nietzsche's Culture of Humanity: Beyond Aristocracy and Democracy in the Early Period, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 278pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107120266.

Reviewed by  Joshua Foa Dienstag, University of California, Los Angeles


Jeffrey Church's new book attempts to settle a dispute that has riven the Nietzsche literature for at least two decades: should we understand the implications of Nietzsche's political theory to be aristocratic or democratic? Both positions have something to be said for them. Church maintains, however, that the best answer is that neither is correct and we should instead recognize Nietzsche's politics as "meritocratic" and even classically liberal: "Nietzsche is neither aristocrat nor democrat, but a classical liberal thinker who seeks to lodge high culture prominently in public esteem" (p. 5).

To substantiate this claim, Church focuses on the texts of what he (and many others) call Nietzsche's "early period" -- roughly from 1870 to 1876 when Nietzsche published the last of his Untimely Meditations. Church argues that in this period we find "clearer statements of his views [on politics] than his later works, which are shot through with ambiguity" (p. 4). Although this limits the scope of the work substantially, Church maintains that the later Nietzsche "revises his fundamental views much less than most scholars assume" (p. 3). This is a very controversial claim to which I will return below.

As Church acknowledges (rather late in the book), the controversy that frames his inquiry is not really about Nietzsche's explicit political views. No one claims that Nietzsche himself was much of a democrat. His denunciations of modern democracy and liberal equality are legion. Rather, a series of political theorists have argued that Nietzsche's radical critiques of language, rationalism, religion and the philosophical tradition can be put to good use as support for an agonistic account of democracy. This position was first argued in depth by William Connolly and Bonnie Honig but has since been taken up widely and provoked a counter-literature that claims that Nietzsche either defends aristocracy or something much worse. Church has read widely in this literature, but his book is oriented by the Straussian approach, which has representatives on both sides of this issue.

Church's strategy is to focus on Nietzsche's project to reform German culture, prominent in his early work, and to associate it with the similar projects proposed by Fichte, Schiller and Herder. As intellectual history, there is a lot to be said for this approach. If Nietzsche had died or stopped writing in the 1870s, we might well group him with these figures as a post-Kantian author for whom "culture" names the highest development of human potential and, thus, the proper (perfectionist) goal for any politics. The idea that Kultur was endangered or already deteriorating under the conditions of modernity was widespread in the German-speaking world in the nineteenth century and, consequently, so were proposals to sustain or repair it.

Nietzsche's ideas about culture were very idiosyncratic, to be sure. Church, in fact, maintains that there are two theories of culture in Nietzsche's early work, one "national" and one "cosmopolitan." These, he argues, are meant to be complementary:

Nietzsche can hold both concepts of culture because they respond to two very different problems. . . . 'national culture' [responds] to the problem of our divided nature, whereas 'cosmopolitan culture' . . . aims to free us from our enslavement to social conventions and needs (p. 146).

Finally though, "the two concepts of culture share a fundamental aim, namely, the establishment of a standard of excellence" (p. 169).

Church's argument that Nietzsche is a 'meritocrat' follows from these ideas about culture. On his interpretation, the best politics of culture for Nietzsche is democratic in the sense that it is open to all and intended to benefit all. However, not everyone can contribute to or benefit from it equally, though not because of any natural differences between classes or castes. Rather, the "best life is not accorded to those gifted by birth, but rather to the achievements of human excellence available to and enjoyed by all humanity" (p. 96). That is, membership in a cultural elite can only be merited by individual achievements that benefit all. So the 'many' and the 'few' are not really distinct groups as in traditional aristocracy and are, in any case, bound together in a functional whole that ends up benefitting both. Church's argument does not really put Nietzsche 'beyond' democracy and aristocracy, as his title claims, but somewhere between them -- his Nietzsche defends an elitist system on universalist grounds.

While Church succeeds in clarifying and deepening our understanding of Nietzsche's cultural politics in the 1870s, it is doubtful whether this analysis can really accomplish the stated aim of changing our perception of the work as a whole. There are several reasons for this.

First, and most importantly: although Church claims that he wants "to privilege the published work . . . [and] to consult Nietzsche's Nachlass and letters to fill in the gaps" (p. 9), in fact he ends up relying heavily on the unpublished writings of the 1870s to make his case. Indeed, the Untimely Meditations is the only published work to receive sustained attention; there is no systematic analysis of the The Birth of Tragedy (1872), which is a considerable omission in a book on the early Nietzsche. Since the published books and essays in the 1870s say hardly anything about Nietzsche's politics per se, Church draws largely on unpublished lectures (especially The Future of Our Educational Institutions) and essays (especially The Greek State) that have only become available in reliable editions in the last few decades.

This is a bit like bringing a knife to a gunfight. While the retrieval of these materials has undoubtedly added something important to our knowledge about Nietzsche's intellectual roots, it will not be enough to persuade most readers to reorient interpretations of Nietzsche derived from his most famous and influential works of the later 1870s and the 1880s (like Beyond Good and Evil and Thus Spake Zarathustra). Church's repeated claim that the later works are ambiguous or unclear is not a particularly strong one and, in any case, is a rather convenient excuse for not engaging them at length.

The problem is that Nietzsche is not an important philosopher because of his (largely unknown) proposals to reform the German educational system. He is an important philosopher because of his famous, radical assault on both ancient and modern moral philosophy as well as his intense individualism and existentialism -- all of which are difficult to reconcile with any systematic account of politics, as Walter Kaufmann first suggested in the 1950s when he emphasized Nietzsche's self-description in Ecce Homo as "the last anti-political German." The more recent democratic and the aristocratic accounts of Nietzsche both struggle with this issue (and have largely succeeded in displacing Kaufmann's Nietzsche) but they do so on the basis of his mature views about morality, reason and language, which only appear in the 1880s.

These elements of Nietzsche's philosophy may be hard to understand and controversial, but they are by no means unclearly stated. Indeed, the later books are models of clarity compared to the essays of the early period, where Nietzsche struggled to distinguish his own perspective from those of his predecessors and lurched from one model to another as he worked out his own positions. Church's claim, for example, that the ideas of national and cosmopolitan culture can be easily harmonized seems to paper over a fundamental contradiction within Nietzsche's early philosophy, one he himself came to recognize.

When Nietzsche looked back over his intellectual trajectory in Ecce Homo, or in the new introductions to his earlier works that he wrote in 1886, he had the perfect opportunity, if he had wanted, to emphasize his debt to German idealism or the continuity of his earlier and later works. Instead, he chose to emphasize the dynamic nature of his thought and the ways in which he had to leave behind his earlier commitments to various teachers and systems in order to discover and display his own philosophy. He may well have exaggerated this development -- but such dynamism and self-overcoming are particularly part of the appeal of Nietzsche to the agonistic or postmodern democrats, who see in this trajectory a model for perpetual self-questioning and foundationless political exchange. It is simply impossible for Church's argument to make a dent in this perspective without addressing the later works in more detail than he does.

Second, the substantive moral and political differences between the earlier and later Nietzsche are much larger than Church wants to admit. Church makes every effort to link Nietzsche to Kant and, indeed, there are some good grounds for doing so, especially in the 1870s. But from reading this book, one would never know, for example, that Nietzsche spent many pages in Beyond Good and Evil carefully dissecting Kant's critical rationalism and demonstrating its reliance on linguistic and grammatical axioms that Kant left unquestioned. Or that, in the later introduction to The Birth of Tragedy Nietzsche lamented his earlier works' "labouring . . . to express strange and new evaluations in Schopenhauerian and Kantian formulations, things which fundamentally ran counter to both the spirit and taste of Kant and Schopenhauer." The division between an early and later Nietzsche is not something that scholars have foisted upon him but rather something he himself insisted upon. And opposition to Kant and his intellectual inheritance is a fundamental cornerstone of the late Nietzsche.

Likewise, while the The Greek State (a very short essay written soon after Nietzsche's army service in the Franco-Prussian war of 1870) celebrated war and slavery and insisted that state and culture were of necessity closely bound together, there is nothing in Nietzsche's later work that makes any parallel claim. Instead, hostility to Bismark's new German state and to the state-form of politics in general become fixed points in Nietzsche's perspective in the 1880s. Church's attempts to bring all of this under the umbrella of "classical liberalism" are the least persuasive parts of his argument.

There is, nonetheless, something quite important and perceptive in Church's general claim that "culture," for Nietzsche, ultimately means not any kind of social identity or fixed set of values but something like a series of remarkable individuals who, in their very difference from one another, offer a disjointed set of exemplars for the rest of us. What Church does not see is that this commitment to a radical reconceptualization of culture ultimately led Nietzsche very far from the project of German Idealism, and farther still from classical liberalism. Whether the "Dionysian pessimism" (as Nietzsche called his later perspective) has a single set of political implications is hard to say, but if so they are stranger and more distant from the classical alternatives than most contributors to the Nietzsche scholarship, including Church, are prepared to consider.