Nietzsche's Ethics

Nietzsches Ethics

Thomas Stern, Nietzsche's Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2020, 70pp., $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781108713320.

Reviewed by Brian Leiter, University of Chicago


This thin book, in the new Cambridge Elements series, purports to "introduce" Nietzsche's ethics in his "late works," meaning from 1886 until his breakdown in early January 1889. This period includes such major works as Beyond Good and Evil and On the Genealogy of Morality, as well as very late works that show some signs of impending insanity, like The Antichrist. Stern never argues that the "late ethics" is discontinuous with Nietzsche's pre-1886 writings about morality; he simply asserts it. According to Stern, Nietzsche's late ethics consists of a descriptive thesis ("Power seeking . . . is biologically essential" for "living things" [6]) and a normative command ("it is ethical to further the goals of Life and it is unethical to impede them" [11]). No text is ever adduced in which Nietzsche says the latter; we will return to the ambiguous evidence for the former. Stern also claims, without any argument or evidence, that the "power-seeking force" is what Nietzsche variously calls "'Life,' 'nature,' 'will,' 'will to life'' or the organic realm" (6).[1]

Stern goes on to attribute to Nietzsche a "Life Theory" according to which "living things are necessarily governed by Life, a force that operates through them to achieve power-increasing ends" (7). What exactly are "power-increasing ends"? Stern never tells us: his general posture is to dismiss "questions about the theory's finer details" as "less pressing" (7), an odd tack in a book meant to assist students. Stern suggests that Nietzsche is describing "the correct version of the will that Schopenhauer was talking about, namely, the one that seeks power, not mere survival and stable reproduction of the species" (9), as Schopenhauer held. Against Schopenhauer's nihilism, "Nietzsche is arguing . . . that affirmation, rather than denial, is best" (11), where "affirmation means to increase, seek power, expand, exploit, while Life-denial means the opposite" (12; cf. 28). (Stern fails to notice that this is not what Nietzsche means by affirmation.[2]) Thus, the core of Nietzsche's ethics is "Affirm life!" where that means affirming "egoism and self-expansion," although he never explains what "self-expansion" involves (13).

Stern also attributes to Nietzsche an objectivist metaethics, based on "a deep, fundamental fact about living things, the Life Theory, which applies at all time and in all places" (23). So, too, "the underlying biological-ethical principle, that Life ought to be affirmed, is held firm at a universal level" (23). Stern cites just two passages, neither of which actually support the point that Nietzsche holds this as an objectively true ethical principle,[3] let alone that he thinks the "fundamental values . . . are . . . fixed by Life" (58). The question of the relationship between claims about will to power and Nietzsche's own evaluative judgments has been extensively discussed by scholars, but Stern appears unaware of this extensive debate (cf. Leiter 2019, Chapter 2 for an overview). There follows (33-45) a superficial paraphrase of the content of the three essays of the Genealogy, in which Stern tries to fit it into the Procrustean bed of the Life Theory. Any naturalistic explanation of any aspect of morality in the Genealogy is now treated by Stern as evidence for the Life Theory, which a more philosophically astute reader might have noticed renders the Life Theory vacuous. Stern concludes (53-58) by considering some modest objections to his reading, as well as what might be left of Nietzsche's ethics without the alleged Life Theory (58-61).

Although Stern makes a great show of "stay[ing] very close to the texts" (3), anyone who is familiar with Nietzsche's late works will see that this is not the case. The Life Theory as Stern describes it is suggested by a few passages in work of 1888, especially The Antichrist, but not much else. The dominant theme, not only in the "late" works, but going back much earlier, is that morality is harmful to the flourishing of the highest human beings, which is why all the features of "life" that Nietzsche claims morality threatens are precisely those he explicitly identifies as essential to human excellence (EH IV:4; cf. see Leiter 2002: 126): morality is hostile to "life" in the rather precise sense that is harmful to the highest forms of human life. In the Preface to the Genealogy, Nietzsche suggests that morality would be "to blame if the highest power and splendor possible to the type man was never in fact attained" (GM P:6). The year before, he laments that Christian morality strives to crush the strong, strike down the great hopes, throw suspicion on delight in beauty, skew everything self-satisfied, manly, conquering, domineering, every instinct that belongs to the highest and best-turnedout type of 'human,' twist them into uncertainty, crisis of conscience, self-destruction" with the result that now "a stunted, almost ridiculous type, a herd animal, something well-meaning, sickly, and mediocre has finally been bred: the European of today." (BGE 62)

In The Antichrist, he writes that Christianity "has waged a war to the death against [the] higher type of person, it has banned all the basic instincts of this type," treating "the strong human being as reprehensible, as 'depraved'" (A 5). For someone supposedly staying "close to the texts," it is astonishing Stern never notices any of this.

One advantage -- beyond fidelity to the texts -- of treating the harm morality does to higher human beings as the core of Nietzsche's complaint is that it avoids the obvious paradoxes of Stern's "Life Theory", which he himself discusses (25-29),[4] and which might make a reader worry whether the Life Theory is correctly ascribed to Nietzsche. But Stern asserts that "the late ethical position is relatively clear" (2) and all we need to do is "assume that [Nietzsche] means what he says" (5). Nietzsche himself cautioned that his writings "are not easily accessible," that they require learning the art of "ruminating" [or Wiederkäuen, literally "chewing cud" like a cow] (GM P: 8). Stern, alas, is not a ruminator.

A striking example is that as textual evidence for the Life Theory, Stern cites BGE 36, never noting -- as Maudemarie Clark (a careful reader of texts) demonstrated thirty years ago (Clark 1990: 212-227) -- that the argument Nietzsche there gives for the will to power as the "basic form of will," from which "all organic functions" derive, invokes an explicit premise (the "causality of the will") that Nietzsche plainly rejected in the prior chapter of BGE! Obviously, then, Nietzsche cannot accept the conclusion of the argument that depends on the premise he rejects, so the passage is performing a different rhetorical function. None of this will be surprising to anyone who sees that Stern's Life Theory is in fact a perfect example of the mistake Nietzsche locates in the Stoics (BGE 9), namely, the mistake of promulgating  a metaphysics of nature as a cover for projecting their own values onto nature. Stern's flat-footed literalism leads him to miss all this, and to think that Nietzsche is "grounding" his values in supposed facts about life (i.e., making the same mistake as the Stoics), rather than engaging in the "legislation of values" (e.g., power is good) characteristic of "true" philosophers (BGE 211).

As should be clear, Stern's hermeneutical posture in this volume is strange. He claims to "read [Nietzsche's texts] in the light of what we know about Nietzsche's background," especially the contemporaneous sources Nietzsche was reading (3). This has been standard scholarly practice in Anglophone secondary literature for more than a generation now (cf. Leiter 2002, discussing Lange and the German Materialists; Janaway 2007, discussing Schopenhauer; Clark and Dudrick 2012, discussing Spir; Riccardi forthcoming, discussing a very wide range of contemporary philosophers and psychologists). What is unusual about Stern's version of such an approach is that he simply assumes that Nietzsche is an uncritical sponge, soaking up ideas and then regurgitating them from these sources (Riccardi forthcoming makes for an instructive contrast). The possibility that Nietzsche reappropriated au courant ideas, transformed them, altering their meaning in service of his own purposes, is never considered.

In the end, what is most puzzling about this little volume is not that it is often wrong, relentlessly superficial, and philosophically flat-footed, although it is all of those things. Rather, it is that the author is so utterly uncurious about Nietzsche's ideas that he cannot be bothered to ask even the simplest questions about texts whose meanings he repeatedly asserts as clear and obvious: he comes across as a presumptuous undergraduate unable to fathom how any meaning could lie beyond his limited grasp.


References to Nietzsche's texts are by part (Roman numeral) and section (Arabic numeral), not pages. I use the standard English-language acronyms: Beyond Good and Evil (BGE); On the Genealogy of Morality (GM); The Antichrist (A); Ecce Homo (EH). I have consulted a variety of translations, though in many cases have modified them or supplied my own; for that purpose, I rely on the Colli and Montinari standard edition of the Sämtliche Werke: Kritische Studienausgabe in 15 Bänden (KSA).

Clark, Maudemarie. 1990. Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).

Clark, Maudmarie and David Dudrick. 2012. The Soul of Nietzsche's Beyond Good and Evil (Cambridge:Cambridge University Press).

Janaway, Christopher. 2007. Beyond Selflessness (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Leiter, Brian. 2002. Nietzsche on Morality (London: Routledge). 2nd edition, 2015.

Leiter, Brian. 2019. Moral Psychology with Nietzsche (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Reginster, Bernard. 2006. The Affirmation of Life (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press).

Riccardi, Mattia. Forthcoming. Nietzsche's Philosophical Psychology (Oxford: Oxford University Press).


[1] This cannot be correct, since Nietzsche is clear that "life" can also lack will to power (e.g., A 6; A 17; TI IX:38), and that "will to power" is just one of the "terrible aspects of reality" alongside affects and desires (EH IV:4). Stern often takes Nietzsche's critique of "anti-natural" morality to be equivalent to morality being "anti-Life" (14-15), yet in almost all the cases, Nietzsche is criticizing moral proscriptions of "natural" instincts, the kind necessary for the strong, higher human being -- a point to which I return, below.

[2] To affirm life is to will the eternal return, i.e., the repetition of one's life in every respect for eternity (what he also sometimes calls amor fati) (BGE 56  EH II:10). See Reginster (2006) for one serious account.

[3] BGE 221 notes that an "unegoistic morality that . . . is directed against everyone" will injure "the higher, the rarer, the privileged." A 11 is a polemic against Kant and the idea of "universal" duties, claiming instead that "everyone should invent his own virtues, his own categorical imperatives."

[4] Briefly, if Life always operates to its own advantage (power-expansion), then Christian morality (as part of life) must too, so there's no need for an ethical command to reject such morality and "affirm life."