Nietzsche's Final Teaching

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Michael Allen Gillespie, Nietzsche's Final Teaching, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 248pp., $35.00, ISBN 9780226476889.

Reviewed by Robin Small, The University of Melbourne


This book is plainly the result of many years of study and thoughtful reflection. While it is presented as a series of essays, it is unified by a strongly argued interpretation of Nietzsche's thinking between 1881 and his catastrophic breakdown in 1889. To understand Nietzsche, the author argues, we must recognise the unique mission that he believed was his personal task in life, and to which all his thinking was meant to contribute in one way or another. Western culture, he thought, was heading toward a total collapse, and his own work could play a decisive role, both in bringing on the crisis and in pointing the way to the new order that would come after.

In order to achieve this aim, Gillespie explains, Nietzsche set out to replace philosophy in its familiar form with a metaphysics that covers the ground of its traditional divisions into ontology, cosmology, theology and rational psychology, but in a negative, destructive way. It is thus an 'anti-metaphysics'. The author's most striking thesis is that Nietzsche's 'final teaching' centres on the thought of eternal return, and that the other themes of his late writing -- the will to power, the death of God, the Übermensch, the notion of nihilism and the Dionysian world-view -- are its "corollaries and consequences" (p. 5).

We know that Nietzsche placed extraordinary importance on the insight that came to him, apparently quite suddenly, during a lakeside walk outside his summer retreat of Sils-Maria in the autumn of 1881. He explored the idea of eternal return in numerous notes and drafts, and presented it to readers in The Gay Science, published a year later, and again in his next book, Thus Spoke Zarathustra. In these texts, the concept is presented not just as perplexing but also as highly dangerous: those who cannot withstand its impact will perish, we are told, and yet anyone who can 'incorporate' the thought (the vividly physical image is just what Nietzsche intends) will be transformed into something higher: apparently, into the Übermensch who is praised as "the meaning of the earth" in Thus Spoke Zarathustra's Prologue.

Does this confirm the doctrine's central place in Nietzsche's thought? The eternal return does not always bring out the best in commentators. Gillespie is certainly right to reject interpretations that turn it into a mere psychological test, suitable for home use, or into a cosmological model with no particular relevance for the individual person. One problem for his view is that the eternal return is barely mentioned in the works of Nietzsche's last few years. Gillespie's response is that these are all preparations for a magnum opus which was to present it in detail. In Nietzsche's opinion, humanity was not yet ready for that challenge. First, it needed to free itself from the persisting influence of religious doctrines and moral values. The destruction of these was the 'no-saying' task of works such as Twilight of the Idols and The Antichrist.

This is a persuasive view of Nietzsche's last books. However, since they are the focus of Gillespie's discussions, a consequence is that the eternal return appears only in passages whose role is to remind us of the book's overall thesis. True, we can only speculate about the unwritten book that might have followed, the genuine counterpart of the Nachlass compilation known as The Will to Power. Still, one misses some discussion of the relevant passages in The Gay Science and Zarathustra, given the author's insistence on the thought's importance. They may not be extended, but they are what he chose to make public at the time. Instead, this book tends to skirt around the concept, allowing only sporadic glimpses from the perspectives of other themes of Nietzsche's last period.

The first two chapters focus on the ideas of nihilism and the Übermensch. Drawing on his earlier Nihilism before Nietzsche, Gillespie argues that Nietzsche was wrong in identifying nihilism with Schopenhauerian pessimism, since his Übermensch has far more in common with the Romantic movement's glorification of the human will and Promethean repudiation of all gods. In opposition to a common reading of Zarathustra's discourse "On the Three Metamorphoses," he suggests that the transition from the lion's destructiveness to the playful innocence of the child is not the end of the story. Zarathustra prophesies what he cannot himself become: the Übermensch who affirms the eternal return of all things and exercises power without regard to good and evil.

The next essay is one of the book's highlights. It deals with the Prefaces that Nietzsche added in 1886 to his earlier books. Gillespie takes them together, since they were written in a single burst and, in effect, form one narrative. He uncovers with skill and subtlety the several layers of self-presentation in these quasi-autobiographical exercises. On Gillespie's account, Nietzsche's often sharp criticism of his earlier work is not quite what it seems: such false steps were a necessary means of preparing for his new task, by making him capable of guiding European culture through a crisis of sickness and recovery similar to his own recent experience.

The longest chapter, "Nietzsche's Musical Politics," is an unusual and original exercise, and for that reason deserves special attention. Its key hypothesis is that Nietzsche's Twilight of the Idols displays the structure of a classical sonata. A detailed analysis of the book's content is given as supporting evidence. Further, Gillespie suggests a rationale for the use of this template: "the new ontology embodied in the eternal recurrence finds its best representation in sonata form." (p. 118) That is because the sonata forms a 'circular whole' in which dissonance and harmony are indissolubly united. In this way, Gillespie concludes, Nietzsche discovers a new musical logic, which takes the place of traditional logic in philosophy, just as his other radical concepts are replacements for ontology, theology and cosmology.[1]

It is impossible not to admire the painstaking detail of Gillespie's analysis. Still, doubts arise. As he explains, the classical sonata has three main sections -- exposition, development and recapitulation -- sometimes preceded by an introduction and followed by a coda. Might it be possible to find something like this pattern in any number of books? This book is itself a good candidate, since it consists of an Introduction, three main sections and a Conclusion. With some work, one could identify contrasting themes which undergo developments along the way before reaching a reconciliation. Suggesting a key or a time signature, as Gillespie does for Twilight of the Idols, might be harder, but should not be ruled out altogether.

Nietzsche too was a keen finder of hidden patterns, at least in his early years. His career-making breakthrough in classical philology was an article on the Greek poet Theognis, published in the prestigious Rheinisches Museum. One of its main aims is to explain the seemingly disordered arrangement of the fragments in the oldest manuscripts. Nietzsche's hypothesis is that each textual unit contains catchwords (Stichworten) located near the beginning and end, and that the catchword at the end of one occurs at the beginning of the next, so that the sequence is linked up in the fashion of a row of dominoes. Later scholars tend to reject Nietzsche's account, noting his resort to ad hoc devices, and even suggesting that his approach could be applied to many other compilations with seeming success.[2] It is possible that Nietzsche saw this himself. Before long, he was engaged in a philosophical project in which the human compulsion to find order and regularity within experience is the basis of a general epistemology. All our knowledge, he now suggests, consists in the patterns we have projected on to an outside world whose nature has no actual resemblance to them. At times, one gets the same feeling when reading scholars who claim to make intriguing discoveries by counting words or paragraphs in Nietzsche's books.[3]

In any case, there are problems with Gillespie's thesis that Twilight of the Idols (and Ecce Homo, he adds) was written in sonata form. Is it likely that Nietzsche went to so much trouble, in a period when he was working non-stop on several books, without leaving any hints? He was not secretive about the design of his writings. In the Preface to On the Genealogy of Morals he tells us that the third essay is an extended commentary on an aphorism that is given at the beginning.[4] In several letters he compares the ending of Zarathustra to the finale of a symphony.[5] In another letter he describes The Wagner Case as "operetta music" -- a throwaway line that Gillespie notes but wisely leaves alone. If any book had been designed to follow a sonata pattern, it is hard to doubt that Nietzsche would have given some indication, either in the book itself, or in correspondence, or in the notes and drafts readily available to today's readers. Gillespie cites nothing that fits the case.

Further, Gillespie's thesis implies that Nietzsche was deeply committed to the sonata form. Yet, apart from Gillespie's own analysis of Twilight, there is no evidence of any such preoccupation. Certainly, Nietzsche was musically well-educated, and must have known what a sonata involved. Further, it is true that his rejection of Wagner's music involved a renewed appreciation of the classical style that culminated in Mozart. Ironically, he thought that the first step downhill toward a music designed to work on the audience's responses (with Wagner as prime culprit) was the entrance of the 'stone guest' in the last act of Don Giovanni.[6] However, the musical genre that he hoped would bring about a renewal of the true Mozartean spirit was comic opera, not the symphony, sonata or concerto. Wagner's legacy in making these forms look superseded was irreversible. If he had changed his mind about this, Nietzsche might have valued Brahms more highly.

One added comment: if Nietzsche were the master of literary form that Gillespie takes him to be, would he have added Book Five to The Gay Science in 1887? The new Book contains some interesting material, but it undermines the work as a whole. It is jarring to go from a challenge set in the individual's "loneliest loneliness" to Nietzsche's self-assigned role as the team coach for an imagined group of 'new philosophers'. That stance is signalled in Book Five's title, "We Fearless Ones," the first of its many uses of the first-person plural. Even on literary criteria, the addition does more harm than good. In place of Book Four's powerful conclusion ("Thus began Zarathustra's going under") we get "To the Mistral," a blustery farrago that ends by urging readers to climb the ladder of heaven and hang their wreath upon a star.[7]

Less likely to provoke sceptical objections are the final two chapters, which relate Nietzsche to other thinkers. One is Dostoyevsky, whose works he had read in French translation -- although not, unfortunately, The Brothers Karamazov, Gillespie's main resource for the comparisons he wants to make. The difference, he argues, is not just between belief and unbelief: both writers reject the old idea of a rational God, just as both reject the Enlightenment's faith in human reason. Whereas for Dostoyevsky God is love, Nietzsche has a new conception of God as 'the highest power' from which, as he puts it, everything follows, including the 'world' (the quotes are Nietzsche's, signalling that this too is a new concept).[8]

The other chapter in this section makes Nietzsche's relation to Plato the starting-point for a treatment of his politics. This is another of the book's highlights. The author's magisterial command of the history of political thought informs an absorbing discussion that ranges well beyond these two figures. At its end, he takes issue with commentators who present Nietzsche and Plato as polar opposites. After all, he points out, Plato is no supporter of the slave morality that Nietzsche identifies with Christianity. Like Nietzsche, he wants to use the warrior spirit to create an aristocracy; yet Nietzsche wants to go further, in order to achieve the Übermensch.

Here and elsewhere in the book, Gillespie expresses doubts about Nietzsche's ultimate objectives or, rather, about the means that Nietzsche believes are required to reach them. What can we learn from the experience of Western society since his diagnosis of decadence and declaration of the onset of nihilism? The great wars he predicted may have occurred, but not other consequences -- unless one takes the way we live now as fitting Zarathustra's description of the 'last men'. At any rate, Gillespie restricts himself to some pointed queries about Nietzsche's acumen as a cultural critic, reaffirming his observation in the Preface that on some points, Nietzsche was simply mistaken.

Nietzsche's Final Teaching is a book that can be warmly recommended to all students of Nietzsche's thought. In its assurance and elegance, Gillespie's writing is a pleasure to read. When combined with his analytic insight and first-rate scholarship, the result is a welcome addition to the Nietzsche literature.

[1] The death of God evidently stands in for theology, but taking the eternal return as an ontology and the will to power as cosmology (p. 188) seems to me the wrong way about.

[2] T. Hudson-Williams, The Elegies of Theognis (G. Bell and Sons, 1910), 13-16.

[3] A case in point is Claus-Artur Schreier's claim that On the Genealogy of Morals is designed according to the 'golden section' -- a form matching the 'golden beings' toward which it aspires. Schreier, "The Rationale of Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morals," in Richard Schacht (ed.), Nietzsche, Genealogy, Morality: Essays on Nietzsche's On the Genealogy of Morals (University of California Press, 1994), 449-59.

[4] Frustratingly, the aphorism is not clearly signalled in the text, and commentators have disagreed over just what it is. My own preference is for the line repeated at the essay's end: "Man would rather will nothingness than not will." But this choice arises from a rather strict understanding of the word 'aphorism', not shared by other Nietzsche scholars -- including Gillespie, for whom the chapters of Zarathustra are aphorisms. (p. 31) See e.g. Christopher Janaway, Beyond Selflessness: Reading Nietzsche's Genealogy (Oxford University Press, 2007), 167-70.

[5] In one letter, he applies the term to Part Three, and in another to Part Four. Still, the idea has been taken seriously: see e.g. Graham Parkes, "The Symphonic Structure of Thus Spoke Zarathustra: A Preliminary Outline," in James Luchte (ed.), Nietzsche's Thus Spoke Zarathustra: Before Sunrise (London: Continuum, 2008), 9 28.

[6] Human, All Too Human, sect. 165.

[7] Admittedly, it is easy to be put off by Walter Kaufmann's English translation, in which the Mistral wind is described as a long-range missile. The point of this interpolation is to provide a rhyme for 'whistle', a problem that Nietzsche did not foresee.

[8] Beyond Good and Evil, sect. 150.