Nietzsche’s Free Spirit Works: A Dialectical Reading

Nietzche S Free Spirit Works

Matthew Meyer, Nietzsche’s Free Spirit Works: A Dialectical Reading, Cambridge University Press, 2021, 289pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781108463904.


Reviewed by Jeremy Fortier, Claremont McKenna College


This is an exemplary book in many ways. The thesis is original, the argument is rigorous, the writing is clear, and the results are stimulating even if one disputes some of the details. Matthew Meyer contends that we can make the best sense of Nietzsche’s writings by identifying narrative structures embedded within them. That said, the scope of Meyer’s enterprise is not always fully captured by his own characterizations of it.

Meyer (and, for that matter, Cambridge University Press in its blurb for the book) frames his contribution as an exegetical commentary on Nietzsche’s free spirit works (Human, All Too Human; Daybreak; The Gay Science):

The primary aim of this book is to advocate for a paradigm shift in the way we interpret the free spirit works that may have consequences for how we understand Nietzsche’s larger oeuvre. (3)

Meyer calls his approach a “paradigm shift” because he wants to show that Nietzsche’s aphorisms are easily misunderstood if they are interpreted as stand-alone arguments, or even as recurring reflections on key themes. According to Meyer, the more than twenty-five hundred aphorisms of the free spirit works fit together as pieces of an intricate and intentional architecture, and ought to be interpreted in light of that architecture no less than the chapters of a serial novel should be interpreted in light of the larger narrative to which they contribute. Accordingly, Meyer proposes that the free spirit works are “best understood as a consciously constructed dialectical Bildungsroman” (33–34). As this implies, Meyer does not claim to have discovered a “smoking gun” establishing authorial intention (45), so he defends his reading in terms of best fit, with an analysis of the free spirit works that emphasizes the internal structure of each text, along with inter-textual allusions among the different works. Meyer is not the first reader to notice that these apparently scattershot collections of aphorisms are much more deliberately structured than they appear at first glance, but he has produced the most comprehensive account of that structure.

Yet as instructive as the exegetical aspect of Meyer’s argument is, his book may be less significant for what it says about how to read Nietzsche than for what it implies about how to do philosophy. And although Meyer has designed his book to focus on the first question, it cannot be disentangled from the second because, as he notes, Nietzsche’s writings “present philosophical truth claims” (27) even though they are not “standard philosophical treatises” (49, 71). This is not breaking news, but Meyer contends that the dominant interpretive approaches have minimized too much of the distance between Nietzsche’s thought and contemporary academic philosophy (9–11, 34–40). In order to widen the gap others have narrowed, Meyer argues against treating Nietzsche’s aphorisms as loosely connected “thought experiments” (3, 95, 113, 123–124), or as a way of laying out and then refining a series of arguments for readers to analyze like so many peer-reviewed articles (71–72). For Meyer, Nietzsche is challenging conventional modes of philosophy by inviting readers to join him on a carefully worked out “journey” or “spiritual exercise” (28, 87–88), and depicting that journey through a narrative that “unfolds” over the course of the free spirit works (28–29, 147, 167, 188–189, 261). This means that there is no necessary correspondence between what Nietzsche writes at a particular point in time and what he believes at that time, any more than there would be for the author of a novel published in serial form (45). Contradictory or evolving arguments within the free spirit works are an attempt to dramatize how and why philosophy can transition from an initial, Enlightenment-inspired commitment to science towards a Dionysian celebration of life-affirming art (5, 47, 69, 127–130, 221–222). Nietzsche lays out this odyssey in stages (rather than dwelling on its endpoint) partly to retrace the path he travelled, but also because in “modern European intellectual culture” one can only arrive at philosophy dialectically, not directly (26–29, 45, 86–88, 111–112, 168, 171). Thus, the ostensibly narrow methodological question Meyer frames his book around (how to read Nietzsche’s free spirit works) opens the door to a much wider field of inquiry (how to do philosophy).

I have laid out the expansive dimensions of Meyer’s argument a bit more baldly than he does, partly to suggest the range of readers who might find the argument worth engaging, and partly to indicate how elaborate a complete assessment would need to be. For present purposes, I will limit myself to suggesting that although Meyer is persuasive in proposing that the free spirit writings ought to be interpreted more along the lines of a work of art, it remains to be clarified how Nietzsche understands the boundaries between philosophy and art, even within his own work.

To see why, consider the programmatic formula with which Meyer’s book opens and concludes, according to which the free spirit works are “a consciously constructed dialectical Bildungsroman” (3, 262). Meyer qualifies this formula by acknowledging that these writings are not a Roman in the strict sense of a “novel,” but only in the looser sense of a “narrative or story” (27). This makes Meyer’s claim more modest (and thus more plausible), while making its implications more indistinct. After all, if the free spirit writings are designed to lead readers towards a union of philosophy and art (as Meyer contends), why invoke an artistic form Nietzsche is not actually using? The anachronism is especially noteworthy given that the early Nietzsche had criticized Plato for putting poetry into the service of philosophy by establishing “the model of a new art form, the model of the novel”.[1] When Meyer cites this passage, he claims that its judgement is controverted in The Gay Science, a work in which “poetry and wisdom merge” as the free spirit starts to advocate for “the union of poetry and philosophy” (199, 184). Yet Meyer also notes that the outstanding example of such a synthesis named in The Gay Science is Ralph Waldo Emerson, and Emerson does not clearly exemplify such a dramatic departure from conventionally discursive philosophy. Stanley Cavell (2003: 17) once characterized Emerson’s prose as “a battle [. . .] not to become poetry,” and in that respect the Concord sage’s predominantly essayistic form arguably stands closer to Nietzsche’s procedure throughout the free spirit works than either do to Plato’s dialogues. The fact that Nietzsche and Emerson also wrote more conventional poetry, but only did so occasionally, supports the suggestion that we are being offered an eccentric middle-ground between poetry and wisdom more than a wholesale merging of the two (it is striking that, although The Gay Science is the first work where Nietzsche mentions his enthusiasm for Stendhal, both here and in later works he draws on Stendhal’s essays even more than his novels). But Meyer does not explain each author’s choice for or against particular artforms, which leaves his account of the free spirit works more imprecise than his taxonomy of Nietzsche’s later writings, which he proposes dividing up and then interpreting along the much more specific lines of Dionysian tragedy, comedy, satyr play, and dithyramb (8, 11–13, 238–239, 241, 258–262).

I do not mean to fault Meyer for adopting Bildungsroman as a descriptive shorthand. But if it matters that Nietzsche did not write a novel, then it also matters why he did not (particularly since, as Meyer points out, the Bildungsroman is most closely associated with one of Nietzsche’s favorite authors, Goethe). Answering that question gives us reason to be skeptical about the first component of Meyer’s programmatic formula, according to which the free spirit works are a “consciously constructed” narrative. To be sure, Meyer qualifies this suggestion: Nietzsche’s narrative is predetermined in broad stages, not in every particular (31). Yet even this qualified claim gives short shrift to what Meyer is generally so attentive to: Nietzsche’s own statements. Meyer is alert to the fact that Nietzsche wrote retrospective prefaces for the free spirit works, and invokes that fact in support of the claim that Nietzsche wanted these writings to be interpreted as a unified narrative (4, 23–26, 52–58). But Meyer does not say a great deal about the substance of those prefaces, and therefore does not note that Nietzsche retrospectively characterized the development of a free spirit as an “unconscious pregnancy”an image which resonates with an important aphorism in Daybreak which also uses the metaphor of pregnancy to present an image of a philosopher as more of a receptive care-taker than a sovereign creator.[2] At any rate, the notion of the free spirit as the product of an “unconscious pregnancy” gives us reason to doubt whether every cardinal feature of the odyssey could be determined in advance, and whether Nietzsche would even have wanted to control the outcome of his work in the way a novelist might do (neither Nietzsche’s retrospective prefaces, nor the autobiographical Ecce Homo, present the major events of his life as the result of much successful intentional planning).

This is not to deny that the free spirit works have a narrative structure, only to suggest that Meyer understates how much Nietzsche thought his narrative was subject to reassessing and repurposing (particularly since Meyer hints atthough does not fully commit toan even larger narrative structure, stretching all the way from The Birth of Tragedy to the last works of 1888). And to the extent that Nietzsche’s oeuvre is deliberately structured, one might ask whether that construction serves “artistic” purposes or “philosophic” ones, since elements of the free spirit narrative are not readily intelligible unless one engages in the kind of laborious interpretive work Meyer does (e.g., to determine to thematic organization of Daybreak, or thread together inter-textual allusions among the various works). In this respect, Nietzsche’s free spirit Bildungsroman is quite unlike Wilhelm Meister's Apprenticeship.

At the end of the day there may be no straightforward analogue to the form Nietzsche adopts in the free spirit works. To my mind, Meyer is more conclusive about what they are not (conventional philosophy) than what they are (the transmutation of philosophy into art). But simply by making the first point so forcefully (and doing so partly by writing so directly and discursivelywhich is to say, so unlike Nietzsche) Meyer opens the door to a host of rich questions about Nietzsche’s “metaphilosophy” (see further Loeb & Meyer 2019).

Let me conclude by briefly mentioning two distinctive features of Meyer’s contribution to the steadily expanding body of scholarship on Nietzsche’s formerly neglected free spirit works. First, the pioneering work on these texts (notably by Keith Ansell-Pearson, Ruth Abbey, and Paul Franco) tended to have an orientation towards political theory, while Meyer’s book is addressed mainly to an audience that comes to Nietzsche through analytic philosophy (although, as a result, some readers may be disappointed to find that Meyer does not discuss scholarship which takes a lead from Nietzsche in considering how different literary forms can serve philosophy, or projects of self-education more generally).[3] Second, no other scholarship on the free spirit works illuminates their architecture in quite the way that Meyer does, as one example will illustrate: these works are typically thought of as three, but Meyer assembles textual evidence to support reading them as five or six (taking Human All Too Human’s two supplements—Assorted Opinions and Maxims and The Wanderer and His Shadow—plus The Gay Science, Book IV as largely independent entities). One need not agree with Meyer’s analysis altogether to see that it will be a key point of reference for anyone who wants to think about the architecture of Nietzsche’s entire oeuvre.


Acampora, Christa Davis. Contesting Nietzsche. University of Chicago Press, 2013.

Cavell, Stanley. Emerson’s Transcendental Etudes. Stanford University Press, 2003.

Hough, Sheridan. Nietzsche’s Noontide Friend.  Pennsylvania State University Press, 1998.

Loeb, Paul & Matthew Meyer. Nietzsche’s Metaphilosophy: The Nature, Method, and Aims of Philosophy. Cambridge University Press, 2019.

Miner, Robert. Nietzsche and Montaigne. Palgrave Macmillan, 2017.

Nehamas, Alexander. Nietzsche: Life as Literature. Harvard University Press, 1985.


[1] The Birth of Tragedy, section 14 (Nietzsche’s emphasis).

[2] See Human, All Too Human, first preface, section 7 and Daybreak, aphorism 552 (also see Assorted Opinions and Maxims, aphorism 216). On the importance of this metaphor for Nietzsche, consider Acampora 2013: 169; Hough 1998: 142–143; Miner 2017: 123–124.

[3] For instance, Meyer cites Nehamas (1985) on a relatively peripheral point rather than on the more central questions of Nietzsche’s metaphilosophy.