Nietzsche's Great Politics

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Hugo Drochon, Nietzsche's Great Politics, Princeton University Press, 2016, 200pp., $27.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691166346.

Reviewed by Andrew Huddleston, Birkbeck, University of London


The idea of a Nietzschean 'politics' has long been under a cloud of suspicion, especially since prominent National Socialists in Germany appropriated Nietzsche as the forerunner of their political agenda. In an effort to distance Nietzsche from this tainted association, subsequent Nietzsche scholarship in the post-war period often focused on individualist themes from Nietzsche centering on private self-cultivation and freedom from herdish conformism. While these apolitical individualist readings, in one form or another, remain the dominant view, Hugo Drochon argues that this approach is in error. In his readable, yet scholarly book, he makes a provocative case that Nietzsche indeed has a politics, and he seeks to outline its contours. The approach throughout the book is methodologically in line with that of the "Cambridge School" of political theory and intellectual history, carefully situating Nietzsche in his biographical, historical and political context. Drochon, to this end, draws not just on Nietzsche's published work, but extensively on his notebooks, lectures, and letters, as well as various sources contemporary to Nietzsche. While one might remain doubtful of various aspects of Drochon's interpretation, this is among the most illuminating studies that have been written on the topic of Nietzsche's political thought. Complementary to the more negative sort of case Tamsin Shaw ably mounts in Nietzsche's Political Skepticism, Drochon's book makes the best case I've come across that Nietzsche has a positive political vision.

Before we get into the details of Drochon's account, a couple of issues are worth considering for framing the interpretive position that he offers. The question of whether Nietzsche has a "politics" can be understood in two different ways. First, does Nietzsche have a political philosophy? That is, does he offer theories about the distinctive questions of political philosophy? Second, does Nietzsche have a political agenda, namely ideas for transforming political institutions or for his broader cultural agenda of a "revaluation of all values" to be implemented through political mechanisms? These might of course overlap and work in tandem, but it is important to see that they are at least potentially distinct. Although Drochon never really separates these, it is a useful distinction for the sorts of issues he wants to consider. After all, some of Drochon's opponents are interested in establishing that Nietzsche doesn't have a political philosophy. Some are interested in establishing that he doesn't have a political agenda. And some are interested in establishing that he has neither.

Relatedly, the word "politics" is used with considerable frequency in this study, following Nietzsche's own occasional use of the phrase "great politics" (e.g., Beyond Good and Evil, §208). In addition to the issue of whether "politics" refers to a political philosophy, a political agenda, or both, much will also turn on how expansive a conception of "politics" (and of the "political") one has in mind. At times, Drochon seemed to be operating with a broad conception indeed, whereby it seemed that virtually anything beyond just the individual was thereby "political." Perhaps little is to be gained by quibbling over the semantics. But Drochon's thesis becomes rather less provocative if the political is thinned down in such a way that it doesn't have much to do with the state or other modes of government, with laws enforced by this government authority, and the like. It was unclear throughout the book how the 'political' and the 'social' differed, if at all. On these fronts, I found there to be a lack of conceptual elaboration and precision around "politics" and its cognates that made the book's thesis and its import somewhat elusive. It would have been good to outline in more detail what scope of the concept "politics" was being assumed, or what it would take for something to count as "political."

Much of Drochon's book is framed as an answer to Bernard Williams, who is skeptical of the idea that Nietzsche has a politics. Williams, posing the challenge that Drochon seeks to meet, writes as follows:

[Nietzsche] provides no way of relating his ethical and psychological insights to an intelligible account of modern society -- a failing only thinly concealed by the impression he gives of having thoughts about modern politics that are determinate but terrible. But we need a politics, in the sense of a coherent set of opinions about the ways in which power should be exercised in modern societies, with what limitations and to what ends (Shame and Necessity, quoted in Drochon, 3).

Williams does not provide a very good foil, however. In the first part of the quotation, Williams implies that Nietzsche doesn't have a politics, in part because he doesn't have a way of relating his ethical and psychological insights to an intelligible account of modern society. Yet this is an odd claim to make. For Nietzsche does relate his ethical and psychological insights to an intelligible account of modern society. Do many sympathetic readers of Nietzsche -- apart from Williams apparently -- really think otherwise? And moreover, how relevant is this to having a "politics?" One could, it would seem, be an excellent diagnostician of social ills without having a politics in any full-blooded or interesting sense. In the second part of the quotation, Williams offers a further criterion: In order to have a politics, one would also need a theory of the way power should be exercised in modern societies, with what limitations and to what ends. This criterion is better, yet it is still too imprecise. Unless governments or laws are involved, it is rather misleading to frame it as a political issue. If one's theory is about how private actors or corporate non-governmental agents should justifiably exercise power, is that a political theory as opposed to a social or ethical one? If so, why? If one takes what Williams says in this passage at face value, it would be rather easy to show that Nietzsche had a politics. One would basically just need to show he has views about modern society. Again, little should turn on the semantics. But I think Drochon is trying to establish something more ambitious, controversial, and thus interesting than what is indicated by Williams's criteria. As a matter of fact, I think Drochon succeeds, according to more plausible criteria, in showing that Nietzsche, in certain key respects, has a politics. The reliance on Williams is therefore unhelpful, since it does not cast into sharp enough relief what Drochon actually needs to show (and to some extent, does manage to show) in making his case.

Drochon's first chapter concerns Nietzsche's relationship to the Greek world and his criticisms of and affinities with Socrates and Plato. Drochon has a good discussion of Nietzsche's ambivalent relationship with Socrates, someone Nietzsche views as both a gadfly worthy of admiration and a decadent worthy of scorn. Drochon's discussion of Plato is more distinctive. One of the most insightful aspects of this chapter is his use of Nietzsche's lectures on Plato, which are often ignored by Anglophone Nietzsche scholars. Drochon is trying to establish a similarity between the supposed Platonic political project (particularly as understood by Nietzsche) and Nietzsche's own supposed political project. Plato, on this view, is someone with both a political philosophy (as elaborated in the Republic and elsewhere) and someone with a political agenda behind his writings. Key to Drochon's chapter is his view of why Plato writes. He is not simply trying to convey abstract philosophical ideas through his dialogues, but (at least on Drochon's reading of Nietzsche's controversial view, as presented in the Plato lectures) to have concrete political effects, including paving the way for the foundation of a new and reformed polis. We should, Drochon suggests, also be attentive to what Nietzsche is trying to achieve through writing (47-8). Even if Nietzsche doesn't mention political change explicitly, he may be trying to effect it through his philosophical works, and Drochon thinks his letters and notebooks provide good evidence of this, a matter to which Drochon returns at the end of the book.

In Chapter 2, Drochon considers Nietzsche's views on the state. He makes a good case for why Nietzsche is not part of the social contract tradition. In making this point about Nietzsche's divergence from such views, Drochon seeks to counter Brian Leiter's influential position that Nietzsche has no political philosophy to speak of (55). Yet Drochon's line here is unpersuasive, because it depends on a misinterpretation of Leiter. He attributes to Leiter the view that in order to have a political philosophy one must have a social contract theory of the state, and then he proceeds to charge Leiter with an overly narrow conception of political philosophy that would, on this basis, exclude Nietzsche. While Leiter does give three examples of figures from the social contract tradition (Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau) as emblematic of political philosophy, nowhere does he claim that subscribing to social contract theory is necessary for having a political philosophy. Indeed, it is clear from the places that Drochon cites in Leiter's work that Leiter takes Marx (presumably no subscriber to social contract theory) to be a paradigm (perhaps even his favored paradigm) of political philosophy. Setting up a straw man in this way is unfortunate, because it distracts from the fact that Drochon actually does go quite some way to establishing (in Chapters 3 and 6 especially) that Nietzsche has a political philosophy and political agenda.

As the chapter continues, Drochon gives a nice reading of Nietzsche's early unpublished piece "The Greek State," in particular bringing out some of the uncomfortable ideas about slavery that Nietzsche broaches there. Drochon further argues that Nietzsche seeks to move away from the decaying nation-state and to refocus normative and political authority in another direction, toward "private companies" (66) taking up the state's functions. Even if true, however, does this help to establish that Nietzsche has a political philosophy or a political agenda? Isn't this is a non-political route for the carrying out of what were previously political functions?

Chapter 3 turns to Nietzsche's views on democracy and related issues. Several commentators have built on Nietzschean themes to develop a more agonal, Nietzschean form of democracy. Others have focused on the aristocratic dimensions of his thinking and the ways in which those are opposed to democracy. Drochon offers a subtle account of Nietzsche's understanding of democracy. This is one of his most successful chapters. One of its virtues is that it helps to establish that Nietzsche has serious philosophical insight to offer on the subject of democracy. Democracy often operates as an unquestioned value in Western political discourse, and Drochon gives us the resources for understanding it more critically through such Nietzschean notions as "herd morality" and "misarchism" (103).

In Chapter 4, Drochon gives a political interpretation of three of Nietzsche's central ideas: the will to power, the Übermensch, and the eternal recurrence. Drochon resists a way of reading these ideas in an overly individualistic fashion. These are not just doctrines in ethics and moral psychology, relating to one's character and attitudes and the like. Rather, he maintains, they have important 'political' application beyond this. Precision around the concept of 'the political' is again an issue here: Is the overman going to have political power, in the sense of being a ruler backed-up by the force of law? Similarly, reactions to the thought of the eternal recurrence may be a guide to separating the strong from the weak. But what are its political implications? Will government intervene and deprive those who fail the eternal recurrence test of certain legal privileges? Is it like a poll test?

In the final two chapters, Drochon presents what he takes to be Nietzsche's positive political agenda. On his reading, this is intimated in the published work, but elaborated in more detail in the unpublished work. Chapter 5 was more stage-setting than anything else, but included a wealth of interesting detail about Nietzsche's envisaged "revaluation of all values." The basic, and quite controversial, line of argument is that Nietzsche turns toward a more political dimension in his re-evaluative enterprise. In Chapter 6, Drochon explores Nietzsche's conception of a "Great Politics." Although it has now become a familiar point that Nietzsche is opposed to German nationalism and Bismarckian power politics, there has been little discussion of what Nietzsche would prefer in its place. Drochon argues, to my mind quite suggestively, that Nietzsche indeed has a geopolitical vision, namely one of a unified continental Europe, led by a "transnational and transracial European caste" (160). In connection with this, Nietzsche wants to encourage a "party of life" that is going to inject life-affirming values into society and is going to pursue a "great politics of breeding a new type of being" (167). Talk of "breeding" brings us into rather uncomfortable territory, which Drochon traverses undaunted. Readings that gloss over the more unsavoury and repellent things that Nietzsche says are legion in philosophical circles, and Drochon, an intellectual historian and political theorist, is courageous for presenting Nietzsche's views unadulterated, something many philosophers seem unwilling to do. Nietzsche does, after all, say that the party of life will need to be involved in the "ruthless extermination of everything degenerate and parasitic" (Drochon quoting Ecce Homo, "The Birth of Tragedy," §4). Shocking, horrifying stuff. Maybe this is a metaphor. Maybe this is rhetorical overkill, given that Nietzsche's views on degeneration are more measured elsewhere (in Human, all too Human, §224, for example.) But whatever it is, we shouldn't let a revulsion toward Nietzsche's vision, and a desire for him to be saying something nicer, cloud our jument about the nasty things he is actually sometimes saying. Drochon faces such things squarely, and it is one of the great merits of his study.

Nonetheless, one still wonders how much actual political authority these characters in the "party of life" are supposed to have. Is it just that they will have an influence on society? Or will the force of law secure their power and back up what they do? It seems to me that the answer to this question is crucial in determining the extent to which Nietzsche, in this respect, has a politics (in any full-blooded sense), or just a vision of and plan for society's betterment, with no clear ideas about how to implement it politically. Still, the "party of life" aside, what Drochon says about a transnational Europe is, to my mind, distinctively political and quite interesting. His book is an important contribution to the scholarly literature on this topic. Those who confidently maintain that Nietzsche has no "politics" will be forced, if not to abandon their view completely, then seriously to reconsider it.


My thanks to Ken Gemes and to Hugo Drochon for their comments on a draft of this review.