Nietzsche's Metaphysics of the Will to Power: The Possibility of Value

Placeholder book cover

Tsarnia Doyle, Nietzsche's Metaphysics of the Will to Power: The Possibility of Value, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 240pp., $99.99, ISBN 9781108417280.

Reviewed by Justin Remhof, Old Dominion University


Tsarina Doyle's new book is required reading for those interested in Nietzsche's metaphysics, ethics, and metaethics. Doyle argues that for Nietzsche nihilism arises upon the recognition that our values are not objectively valid because they are not instantiated by a mind-independent world. Nietzsche responds to the threat of nihilism, according to Doyle, by developing will to power as a metaphysical view of reality. On this view, the world is constituted by mind-independent causal powers. For Doyle, Nietzsche believes values are metaphysically continuous with will to power because they are causal-dispositional properties of human drives. Will to power provides a mind-independent, objective constraint on our values, which moves us beyond nihilism.

Doyle's position is bold, and certainly contentious. In what follows, I will summarize each chapter and offer some evaluative comments.

In Chapter 1, Doyle holds that non-objectivist and metaphysically neutral accounts of values fail to provide adequate responses to nihilism. Doyle first looks at fictionalist views of values developed in "On Truth and Lies in a Non-Moral Sense" (TL) and in Human, all-too-Human (HH). In TL, Nietzsche claims that science is on a par with art because both deal strictly in illusion. Only art openly accepts that human experience is enmeshed in illusion, however, and so art has a better way of overcoming the meaninglessness associated with nihilism. Embracing illusion then appears to license a fictionalist understanding of our values, that is, the view that values are subjective fictions that help us overcome the fact that we are not in touch with reality.

In HH, Doyle argues that Nietzsche changes gears and endorses the view that science reveals the way the world is. And the world is inherently devoid of values. Art can help us overcome this loss of value only insofar as art can provide a model of illusion that renders value fictionalism sufficiently motivating. Doyle argues that various versions of the fictionalist view that values are merely subjective projections onto a valueless world -- specifically, those offered by Hussain (2007) and Reginster (2006) -- fail to motivate sufficiently, and thus fail to respond to nihilism.

Doyle then turns to Poellner's (2007) non-cognitivist reading. Poellner associates values with attitudes that are not truth-apt, and his account purports to remain agnostic about metaphysical commitments. Doyle contends that such attitudes cannot be separated from the way the world is, such that overcoming nihilism requires some metaphysical view or other. Chapter 1 therefore motivates the need for an objectivist, metaphysical reading of Nietzsche's view of value.

It might strike readers as strange that Doyle looks to early works as TL and HH to find how Nietzsche supplies a value theory that responds to nihilism. Although TL and HH might provide helpful foils for developing and challenging different versions of fictionalism, nihilism does not become an explicit concern for Nietzsche until years later. It might have been better to examine The Gay Science (GS), a middle-period work where Nietzsche proclaims the death of God, an event which obviously issues in some form of nihilism. Importantly, in GS Nietzsche claims that the world is inherently valueless, but he also champions the life-affirmative power of art and often remarks on the positive transformative power of certain values and ways of valuing. Nietzsche therefore appears to think some form of value fictionalism can help respond to nihilism. Unfortunately, Doyle does not pursue this possibility.

In Chapter 2, Doyle argues that Nietzsche eventually embraces objectivism about value. Three steps take us to objectivity. Nietzsche (1) comes to deny that science is value-free, so that (2) values are required for understanding the way the world is, and even that (3) values can be veridical and non-veridical. It is clear that Nietzsche embraces (1), and I will address (3) below when I examine moral facts. Here I pause to investigate (2), since going forward it plays a large role in the book.

According to Doyle, Nietzsche believes values are necessary conditions for gaining knowledge of the world, but values in no way contribute to constituting the nature of empirical objects. Values simply highlight and frame which features of mind-independent objects we attend to. Objects are then constitutively mind-independent. Call this view non-constructivism, since it opposes the neo-Kantian constructivist view that the properties of objects are constitutively mind-dependent (full disclosure: I defend constructivism in Remhof 2017; see also Nehamas 1985; Anderson 1998; Cox 1999).

It is absolutely crucial for Doyle to show that Nietzsche is a non-constructivist, especially from GS onward. Many parts of her project hang in the balance. Non-constructivism, according to Doyle, grounds Nietzsche's view of objectivity (pp. 70, 73-78); challenges the claim that Nietzsche is sympathetic to value fictionalism (p. 93); shows that Nietzsche rejects Kant's account of synthesis, which provides the justificatory groundwork for Nietzsche's will to power metaphysics (pp. 102, 105-119); motivates Nietzsche's naturalistic, non-eliminativist conception of mind (pp. 196-197); and supplies a mind-independent view of empirical reality necessary for overcoming nihilism (pp. 5-6). Non-constructivism has incredibly heavy lifting to do.

But there are good reasons to suppose that Nietzsche is a constructivist. He proclaims, "it is enough to create new names and valuations  . . .  in order to create new 'things'" (GS 58). Nietzsche likely scare-quotes 'thing' because he is offering something radical: he claims that applying concepts and values to the world can actually bring objects into existence. He notes, "A thing = its qualities; but these equal everything which matters to us about that thing; a unity under which we collect the relations that may be of some account to us" (KSA 12:2[77]). Objects are groups of properties unified in relation to our interests. Unification occurs by the application of concepts, which are always value-laden. Nietzsche says, "A 'thing' is the sum of its effects, synthetically united by a concept" (KSA 13:14[98]). We conceptually organize properties into objects. We therefore have the power to construct objects. Nietzsche even holds that such constructive activity is necessary for gaining knowledge of the world: "we can comprehend only a world that we ourselves have made" (KSA 11:25[70], cf. GS 301). The world we experience and know is mind-dependent.

To support her non-constructivist reading, Doyle points to only one passage (KSA 13:14[186]) where Nietzsche seems to suggest that bundles of forces are unified intrinsically. But this view is contested and qualified by numerous other notebook passages, specifically those which claim that forces are ontologically interdependent on all other forces, including the constructive activities of human organisms. While Doyle helps herself to Nietzsche's notes, she never explains why or how we should use the notebooks, which could in itself be a problem for readers. Moreover, constructivism shows up again and again throughout Nietzsche's published and unpublished work from GS onward. Doyle does offer some interesting arguments against reading Nietzsche as an idealist (see, e.g., pp. 118-119), but does not address key constructivist passages that challenge her reading.

One important reason for determining whether Nietzsche is sympathetic to constructivism turns on his view of responding to nihilism. Nietzsche famously holds that embracing a "true world" is nihilistic. Commitment to the true world must be overcome to overcome nihilism. But an essential feature of the true world is the existence of a constitutively mind-independent reality, empirical or otherwise. Doyle's view that Nietzsche endorses constitutively mind-independent objects therefore falls dangerously close to a position Nietzsche might reject as contributing to nihilism, rather than overcoming it.

Chapter 2 continues by introducing a comprehensive view of science, namely, a view of science which seeks to understand the world as will to power. For Doyle, values are metaphysically continuous with will to power because they are a particular type of causal activity instantiated in the lives of human beings. This preserves the objectivity of value without rendering value fictional or metaphysically neutral. This chapter also contains a nice sketch of how understanding values as metaphysically continuous with the nature of reality can account for Nietzsche's view of value creation without lapsing into value fictionalism.

In Chapter 3, Doyle attempts to provide a justification for her reading of will to power by arguing that Nietzsche derives will to power as a response to Kant's transcendental idealism. The chapter has three parts. The first examines Nietzsche's qualified praise of Kant's aim to establish, against Hume, the objective applicability of the concept of causality. The second part shows how Nietzsche develops will to power as a naturalist response to Kant's account of synthesis in the Transcendental Deduction. According to Doyle, will to power provides a mind-independent explanation of causal relations that are both empirically and metaphysically real. The third part of the chapter addresses the objection that will to power is a normative view of human life, rather than a metaphysical thesis.

To be convincing, Chapter 3 faces a sizable uphill battle. Many readers (1) prefer a mere psychological or normative reading of will to power, and thus (2) reject reading will to power as a metaphysical thesis, and (3) certainly do not see will to power as a response to Kant's view of synthesis in the deduction of the categories. Doyle provides a sustained discussion of Clark and Dudrick's (2012) interpretation of BGE 36 in order to challenge (1)-(2), which is a welcome contribution to the literature. But challenging (3) is difficult, since there is simply no direct textual evidence for the claim that Nietzsche justifies will to power as a response to Kant's view of synthesis. Thus, much of Chapter 3 attempts to fill in missing details -- for instance, by discussing disagreements between Leibniz and Descartes on force, stringing together a decade and a half of Nietzsche's different readings of Kant's pre- to post-critical views of force, teasing out consequences of Nietzsche's apparent praise of Kant's attempt to overcome Hume's challenge to causality, and, of course, showing that all these factors contribute to warranting a metaphysical reading of will to power. No doubt some will find these reconstructive links tenuous, and I will leave it to readers to assess whether Doyle's account succeeds.

In Chapter 4, Doyle contends that Nietzsche identifies values with dominant causal-dispositional properties of intentionally directed human drives. Such properties are manifest affectively and evaluate their environment in a normative sense by seeking to overcome resistance. Values are part of the causal nature of reality and not reducible to Humean subjective projections onto a valueless world. Indeed, Doyle finds in Nietzsche no basic ontological difference between values and facts. She contends that values are objective if they manifest in cooperation with the natural dispositional powers that constitute the world, and subjective if not. Noble values, for instance, are objective because they cooperate with the dynamic nature of reality, whereas slavish values are subjective because they resist reality. Objectivity is a matter of degree. The more power a value has to move an agent to overcome resistance successfully in accordance with the way the world is, the more objective the value. Doyle closes the chapter by arguing that the normativity provided by drives has the same modal structure as the causal processes of nature, and that our reasoning practices derive from a dispositional account of value.

Three things should be noticed. First, Doyle's account renders Nietzsche a moral naturalist. Moral naturalism is a realist view of morality which holds that there are naturally occurring moral facts and properties, which are typically considered mind-independent. Yet, Nietzsche proclaims that "there are no moral facts at all" (TI "Improvers" 1). This passage -- and there are others -- appears to directly challenge Doyle's reading. But she does not cite or attempt to explain away such texts. Doyle does believe values are pluralistic rather than universal, however, which is one important way her account differs from moral realism.

Additionally, there is reason for thinking that values and causes come apart. For instance, inspired by Crispin Wright (1992), we might notice that causal properties play significantly different explanatory roles than value properties, which could justify important distinctions in kind between the two. Value properties only explain cognitive effects, for instance. They are not the kind of thing that can explain physical effects, like falling on wet rocks, the presence of lichen on wet rocks, or my interest in attending to my hands after touching wet rocks (see Wright 1992: 197). The fact that values and causes share a modal structure might be one important similarity, but ontologically important explanatory differences abound. It is hard to see how values and causes, then, are not different in kind.

Finally, a word on objectivity. Nietzsche never says that objective values are those that cooperate with the basic nature of reality, despite Doyle's claim to the contrary (see p. 181 on GM III: 12). Doyle might have been on better grounds using 'objectivity' merely technically -- after all, her special employment of the term is worth thinking about. To the extent that she intends to interpret Nietzsche's own use of 'objectivity', she might arouse some incredulous looks.

In Chapter 5, the final chapter, Doyle examines issues surrounding the causal efficacy of conscious thought. She first argues that Nietzsche follows Leibniz in adopting an anti-Cartesian but non-eliminativist conception of the mind. She adds that Nietzsche goes further in following Kant by rejecting the mind conceived as substance. Next, she contends that Nietzsche vacillates between two non-eliminativist, naturalist accounts of the causal efficacy of consciousness. One holds that consciousness is an intrinsic property of the mind, which runs against Nietzsche's anti-Cartesianism, but secures the causal efficacy of consciousness. The second secures the extrinsicality of consciousness but sacrifices causal efficacy. Doyle then attempts to reconstruct an argument for Nietzsche that retains key anti-Cartesian and non-eliminativist elements by appealing to the role of causal powers supplied by will to power. She closes the chapter by examining whether this reconstruction commits Nietzsche to panpsychism, since she takes causal powers to be intentional. Those concerned with Nietzsche's philosophy of mind and action should pay attention to this chapter.

What we do not find at the end of the book is a discussion of nihilism. The book challenges other readings of Nietzsche's view of value because they fail to respond to nihilism, but there is no sustained discussion of how Doyle's reading responds to nihilism. We are left with crucial questions. For example, how does reconceiving value in terms of will to power provide sufficient practical motivation to overcome nihilism? Also, what is the role of higher values in overcoming nihilism? Doyle tells us that any objective value is also a higher value (p. 183), but this seems to dilute the relevance of such values, and Nietzsche thinks there is much more involved in a value's being higher. Addressing issues like these would have been a nice end to the book.

Overall, Doyle's work is an important contribution to the literature on Nietzsche. She attempts to take no prisoners: she fully embraces a controversial reading of will to power, for instance, and argues that Nietzsche believes there are mind-independent values embedded in reality, in part by collapsing the longstanding fact-value distinction. Going big, however, requires jumping big hurdles. I have suggested that Doyle has a tendency not to address passages that directly challenge her reading, and to reconstruct arguments that move quite a distance from what the texts show, which could leave readers frustrated. Nonetheless, there is no question that the book has a lot to offer, and Nietzsche scholars should take note.


My thanks to Tsarina Doyle for comments on an earlier draft of this review.


Anderson, Lanier R. "Truth and Objectivity in Perspectivism," Synthese 115 (1998): 1-32.

Clark, Maudemarie and David Dudrick. The Soul of Nietzsche's "Beyond Good and Evil" (Cambridge University Press, 2012)

Cox, Cristoph. Nietzsche: Naturalism and Interpretation Berkeley: University of California Press, (1999).

Hussain, Nadeem J.Z. "Honest Illusion: Valuing for Nietzsche's Free Spirits," in Brian Leiter and Neil Sinhababu (eds.), Nietzsche and Morality (Oxford University Press, 2007), pp. 157-191.

Nehamas, Alexander. Nietzsche: Life as Literature (Harvard University Press, 1985).

Poellner, Peter. "Affect, Value, and Objectivity," in Brian Leiter and Neil Sinhababu (eds.), Nietzsche and Morality (Oxford University Press, 2007), pp. 227-261.

Reginster, Bernard. The Affirmation of Life (Harvard University Press, 2006).

Remhof, Justin. Nietzsche's Constructivism: A Metaphysics of Material Objects (Routledge, 2017).

Wright, Crispin. Truth and Objectivity (Harvard University Press, 1992).