Nietzsche's Moral Psychology

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Mark Alfano, Nietzsche's Moral Psychology, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 299pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107074156.

Reviewed by Mattia Riccardi, University of Porto


After decades of neglect, work on Nietzsche's philosophical psychology in general, and on his moral psychology in particular, has been flourishing. Mark Alfano's monograph is an important contribution to that ongoing debate. More specifically, Alfano can (and does) claim originality for systematically adopting a digital humanities approach, on the one hand, and for putting forward a distinctive virtue-theoretic reading of Nietzsche's moral psychology, on the other hand. In fact, a semantic approach is not entirely new to Nietzsche scholarship: the (sadly interrupted) Nietzsche-Wörterbuch project was based on a similar methodology (see Van Tongeren et al. 2004). A collaborator on that project also produced a virtue-theoretic reading of Nietzsche's mature philosophy (see Zibis 2007, which Alfano, unfortunately, does not discuss). This seems to suggest that a semantic approach to Nietzsche's digital corpus helps to bring out how pervasive his virtue talk is.

Part I (chapters 1 and 2) introduces the methodology employed throughout the book: (i) individuating the "core constructs", i.e., the key notions, of Nietzsche's moral psychology; (ii) mapping their relations (in the whole corpus as well as in individual works); and (iii) carefully analyzing all their relevant occurrences. Part I illustrates how the first two steps are realized. (As we shall see, analyses of the core constructs' occurrences, which constitutes the backbone of Alfano's overall reading, are made throughout the book). In order to map the core constructs of Nietzsche's moral psychology, Alfano provides a list of German terms paired with their English equivalents and explains how he searched for them using the Nietzsche Source digital edition. There are some problems with the English-to-German list, though (see p. 15). For instance, Alfano assumes that the construct corresponding to the English term "emotion" can be individuated by searching the German radicals "emotion*", "gefühl*" and "rührung*". "Gefühl", however, translates "feeling", and not "emotion". Moreover, "emotion" is a relatively rare word in 19th century German. ("Gemütsbewegung" is another term used to translate English's "emotion" and the French "émotion"). Instead, Nietzsche frequently uses "Affekt", which Alfano treats separately, and "Leidenschaft", which translates as "passion" and does not appear on the list at all. Thus, there is in this case a mismatch between the construct Alfano wants to search for -- "emotion" -- and what he actually searches for: German words that do not accurately translate "emotion" (at least not in Nietzsche's German). Less serious cases are, for instance, the construct "joy", that should have included "fröhlich*", the "gay" of Gay Science, or tragedy, that should have included "tragisch*". I do not think, however, that such issues affect Alfano's main results, for he seems to have tracked with enough accuracy the core virtue-related constructs on the analysis of which his reading is mostly built.

The rest of Part I offers tables and diagrams that helpfully visualize the results of the semantic search of the core constructs. Those on p. 25 offers a corpus-wide overview. The most robust construct turns out to be "life", immediately surrounded (in the diagram) by others such as "value", "emotion" (about which, however, see the worries raised above), "virtue", "fear", "instinct", "conscience", "doubt" and "contempt". As Alfano notes, emotions and virtues are clearly preeminent. (One might wonder why Alfano included "life" in his semantic search at all, as it is not obviously a moral psychology category. In fact, no detailed analysis of that construct is provided: Alfano himself admits that he leaves it "unarticulated" (97). It thus remains unclear which role it is supposed to play in Nietzsche's moral psychology and, more generally, what its meaning is supposed to be.)

Part II offers Alfano's general picture of Nietzsche's moral psychology. In chapter 3, he argues that drives and instincts -- the most basic constructs when it comes to Nietzsche's views about human psychology -- are "act-directed . . . motivational and evaluative dispositions" (50). The emerging picture is largely in agreement with the most recent literature. Alfano's most original claim here concerns the difference between drives and instincts, which most Nietzsche scholars tend to treat as basically synonymous (see, for example, Katsafanas 2016). Instead, Alfano argues that Nietzsche uses "instinct" to refer to innate drives (see pp. 69-72). However, the textual evidence on which this claim is based seems thin to me. Alfano discusses four passages in which Nietzsche "explicitly describes instincts as innate" (69). There are reasons to doubt this is the case. Take the first passage, where Nietzsche writes that we need to "combat our inborne heritage and implant in ourselves a new habit, a new instinct, a second nature" (HL 3, quoted on p. 69). But if we can acquire "new" instincts contrary to our "inborne heritage", it rather seems that those instincts are not innate. (I can't discuss the three other passages in detail here. My impression is that at best they only license the conclusion that some instincts are innate, not that all are.)

The construct Alfano turns to next is "type". Nietzsche frequently describes human individuals as instances of a certain type (see Leiter 2002). What then is a type? According to Alfano, one's drives and instincts determine the type one is. However, since he argues that Nietzsche takes drives and instincts to be relatively plastic, he concludes that one's psychological profile isn't fixed. Though "a person's type constrains the psychology that she can develop" (84), there remains enough elbowroom. More precisely, Alfano defines a "drive vector" as the "set of drives a person actually embodies" and a "drive set" as the "set of drive vectors within a person's reach" (84-85). Types, he argues, are just such drive sets. (Pace Alfano (see pp. 83-84), however, I don't think there is any substantial difference between this reading and Leiter's. For Leiter grants that "natural facts about a person circumscribe what that person becomes, though within the limits set by the natural facts, the precise details of what a person becomes depend (causally) upon other factors" (Leiter 2002: 81).)

Chapters 4 and 5 sketch the virtue-theoretic framework at the heart of Alfano's reading. His main claim here is the "type-relative unity of virtue thesis", according to which "a person's flourishing is a matter of developing and acting from drives that fit both the type she embodies and the material and social environment in which she finds herself" (98). What does this mean? First, as different people embody different types, there will be no unique way for them to flourish. Since virtues are supposed to contribute to one's flourishing, there will be different virtues for different types. In fact, what counts as a virtue for type X may count as a vice for type Y, and vice versa. So much for virtue type-relativity. What about virtue unity? Whatever type you may happen to embody, for you to flourish some sort of "alignment" needs to obtain among your drives (97). Alfano then makes clear that the required alignment has both an internal and an external dimension: a drive is a "candidate virtue when it is integrated both with the agent's other drives and with their social or cultural context" (139). Take internal integration first: if my drives were constantly pushing me in different directions, I would hardly count as a functional agent. Thus, some sort of psychological "harmony" is necessary. External integration, on the other hand, requires that the expression of one's drives is approved or, at least, not sanctioned by one's community (see again p. 139). The drives that are integrated both internally and externally count as virtues (for the relevant type). Though I -- as many other scholars, see e.g., Gemes 2009 and Katsafanas 2016 -- agree that Nietzsche sees internal integration as a necessary condition of human flourishing, I am more skeptical about the role of external integration. As this is an issue that can be better appreciated once the details of Alfano's virtue-theoretic reading are in place, I shall come back to it later.

Part III (chapters 6 to 11) offers a detailed analysis of five Nietzschean virtues: curiosity, courage, pathos of distance, sense of humor and solitude A further claim is that these virtues are united by conscience. Of course, given the type-relative unity of virtue thesis, these are not universal virtues. Rather, they are virtues for the type embodied by Nietzsche himself. Similarly, the kind of conscience fostering their integration is a specific form of conscience, i.e., the intellectual one. I shall briefly review Alfano's treatment of the five key Nietzschean virtues (in a different order) and then raise two general worries about his reading.

Nietzschean curiosity is traced back to an "insatiable drive to engage in inquiry" -- especially of "interesting subjects" -- that is "both intellectually and morally challenging" (158). Alfano links curiosity to Nietzsche's perspectivism by arguing that the latter is best understood as a methodology designed to express the former and consisting in the ability to "shift emotional perspectives" (154). Though Alfano's discussion of curiosity and perspectivism is insightful, he never explains what makes a certain subject "interesting" and thus suitable for curiosity, nor why moral issues should be among the primary concerns of that virtue. (This is an issue I shall come back to later.)

Curiosity is obviously an epistemic virtue. According to Alfano, the same also holds for Nietzschean courage and sense of humor. Roughly, the story goes like this. Curiosity leads one to investigate how things really are. But finding out how things really are often means having to abandon cherished illusions both about the world and about oneself. Possessing courage is a way to face up to such a dismal endeavor. Another is to possess a sense of humor, for it helps to detach oneself from one's own values and beliefs as well as to affirm the hard truths one has discovered. Thus, curiosity, courage and sense of humor turn out to be mutually supportive -- i.e., internally integrated -- epistemic virtues.

Nietzschean solitude also has an epistemic function, according to Alfano, since it constitutes "a penchant for challenging the doxastic and axiological truisms of one's community" (239). By being alone, one steps back from ordinary life and is thus in a position not only to critically assess the social practices we unreflectively go along with, but also to gain self-understanding. As such, solitude "fosters authenticity" (251). As long as it allows one to take a "distant and elevated perspective" on the community one lives in (233), solitude also relates to the last of the Nietzschean virtues worked out by Alfano, viz. the pathos of distance.

Compared to the other Nietzschean virtues we have surveyed, the notion of "pathos of distance" is likely to sound somewhat obscure. The phrase was coined by Nietzsche. Moreover, as Alfano stresses, he only uses it a few times. So why give it such preeminence? Alfano (correctly, I think) provides two reasons for doing so: first, the pathos of distance turns out to be a particular form of contempt, which is pervasive in Nietzsche's writings; second, and somewhat unexpectedly, Nietzsche often argues that contempt is a beneficial attitude. Alfano tries to show that this is true of all the four kinds of contempt traditionally distinguished by Bernard de Clairvaux: contempt for the world (spernere mundum), contempt for no one (spernere neminem), self-contempt (spernere se ipsum) and contempt for being oneself an object of contempt (spernere se sperni). I can't here discuss the details of Alfano's interesting analysis of what Nietzsche says about the varieties of contempt. I'd rather point out what strikes me as the major weakness here. Alfano argues that the pathos of distance is some sort of "refined contempt" and "refined disgust" (211; the first expression is taken from GS 379). Later he claims that it is "the Nietzschean virtue that governs both contempt and disgust" (215). The basic idea, as I understand it, is that the pathos of distance "recruits" contempt and disgust for the kind of inquiry already supported by other epistemic virtues such as curiosity and courage (see p. 215). However, the few times Nietzsche talks of the pathos of distance he seems to have something more specific in mind, namely that it constitutes a presupposition for value-creation (see, in particular, GM 1.2, quoted on p. 212). Thus, if the pathos of distance is to count as a virtue at all,[1] it seems to amount to the (flourishing-enhancing) disposition to set one's own values.

There are two last general issues I'd like to raise. First, given Alfano's characterization of the Nietzschean virtues, I wonder whether external integration is a universal condition for a drive to count as a virtue. Alfano distinguishes between those having a "slavish mind-set" and those having a "masterly mind-set" (140). Whereas the former individuals tend to form a self-picture based on other people's judgments about them, the latter tend to form a self-picture based on their own judgments about themselves. Consequently, external integration does not seem to play any crucial role when it comes to determine the virtues of the masterly type, for part of having the corresponding mind-set consists in not relying on social approval or disapproval. This conclusion is further supported by the very features of the Nietzschean type, which obviously belongs to the masterly camp. For embodying virtues such as pathos of distance and solitude seems to imply some sort of psychological immunity from external approval or disapproval.[2] To put it another way: rather than being a universal condition for a drive to count as a virtue, external integration seems to be a criterion that already presupposes a "slavish mind-set".

Second, Alfano constantly stresses the epistemic dimension of the Nietzschean virtues. Though it is surely right that the Nietzschean type has a robust commitment to knowledge and self-knowledge, Alfano seems to miss, or at least to drastically underplay, that its most fundamental trait consists in the capacity to create values: "true philosophers [who, I take it, are just exemplars of the Nietzschean type] are commanders and legislators", i.e. those "who first determine the 'where to?' and 'what for?' of people" (BGE 212). As an illustration, consider again Alfano's treatment of the pathos of distance. Whereas he focuses on the epistemic benefits of embodying that virtue, it seems clear from Nietzsche's own characterization that what is at stake is rather value creation. Of course, value creation by true philosophers requires engaging in epistemic activities. These, however, should remain subordinated to the normative project of revaluation. As you may recall, Alfano could not say what makes a certain subject of inquiry "interesting" for the Nietzschean type, nor why its curiosity should be drawn to "intellectually and morally challenging" issues. Answers to such questions, I submit, are given by the fact that exemplars of that type -- true philosophers -- are invested in value creation.

Alfano's virtue-theoretic reading is a stimulating and original contribution to the lively debate about Nietzsche's moral psychology. Everyone interested in that debate should read his book.


Gemes, K. 2009. "Nietzsche on Free Will, Autonomy and the Sovereign Individual" in K. Gemes and S. May (eds.) Nietzsche on Freedom and Autonomy. Oxford University Press, 33-50.

Katfafanas, P. 2016. The Nietzschean Self: Moral Psychology, Agency, and the Unconscious. Oxford University Press.

Leiter, B. 2002. Nietzsche on Morality. Routledge.

Van Tongeren, P., et al. (eds.). 2004. Nietzsche-Wörterbuch: Vol. 1. De Gruyter.

Zibis, A.-M. 2007. Die Tugend des Mutes: Nietzsches Lehre von der Tapferkeit. Königshausen & Neumann.

[1] In fact, rather than being itself a virtue, I think Nietzsche sees the pathos of distance as the paramount affective upshot of the virtue of nobility. (Though Alfano is right that Nietzsche often uses the same expression to refer both to a virtue and to its affective manifestation, the word "pathos" more naturally applies to the latter rather than to the former. Note also, moreover, that contempt and disgust are usually taken to be affective states.) If this is true, it reinforces my point, for Nietzsche often claims that nobility involves the capacity to set one's own values (see, for instance, BGE 260 and 287).

[2] Solitude, for instance, is the "drive to get emotionally away from and above one's community" (243).