Nietzsche’s Philosophical Psychology

Nietzsche S Philosophical Psychology

Mattia Riccardi, Nietzsche’s Philosophical Psychology, Oxford University Press, 2021, 249pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198803287.

Reviewed by Christopher Fowles, University of Oxford


The opening book of Beyond Good and Evil concludes with the claim that psychology is “once again the path to the fundamental problems” (BGE §23). As is now common to note, despite such remarks, Nietzsche’s barely-concealed interest in psychology was for the longest time a rather neglected topic in Nietzsche scholarship. Happily, the situation today is much improved, with major contributions from Paul Katsafanas (2016) and Brian Leiter (2019) entrenching Nietzsche’s writings on the mind as an area of considerable philosophical interest. Prominent in these discussions has been Mattia Riccardi, whose much anticipated book presents an illuminating systematic reconstruction of Nietzsche’s views. While some topics therein will be familiar to those acquainted with Riccardi’s work, the book contains plenty of new material as well as several refined or modified statements of Riccardi’s previous positions. This book is an excellent addition to the literature and will be essential reading for anyone interested in Nietzsche, as well as offering much of value to those working on philosophical psychology more broadly.

Riccardi’s book is divided into three parts. In the first, Riccardi examines the core elements of Nietzsche’s mature psychology, providing accounts of the drives and affects (Chapters 2 and 3), and the structured relations in which they stand (Chapter 4). The views that emerge fit together neatly. Drives are “dispositions towards patterns of goal directed behaviour” (32) characterized by an urging nature and evaluative component. More precisely, drives are complex ‘multi track’ affective dispositions, which incline towards unified sets of emotions (66–67; see Deonna & Teroni, 2007). So understood, affects, as states of feeling with valenced representational content, “mediate the discharge of [a] drive by adapting it to a given situation” (47). Riccardi employs these readings to elaborate Nietzsche’s characterization of the ‘soul’ as a “social structure of drives and affects” (BGE §12). In contrast to ‘vitalistic’ and ‘normative’ interpretations of this metaphor, which present Nietzschean drives as homunculi, Riccardi offers a Hume-inspired, deflationary-causal approach that avoids the philosophical and textual problems that beset the other readings. The soul’s order is not occurrent but dispositional, concerning the power of drives to effect certain outcomes (Cf. Hume, THN 12). This, Riccardi argues, allows us to make sense of Nietzsche’s remarks about ‘social’ structures without treating drives as full-blown agents.

The second part of Riccardi’s book (Chapters 5–7) moves from these deep-lying features of the mind to consciousness, which, as Riccardi notes, Nietzsche famously brands a “surface” (EH “Clever” §9). Consciousness has been the locus of much discussion regarding Nietzsche’s philosophy of mind, and not without reason. The inadequacy of conscious thought and the threat posed by the misunderstandings it engenders are central themes in Nietzsche’s mature writings. Furthermore, his remarks are perplexing. Nietzsche presents consciousness as at once a danger—error-strewn, superficial, misleading—and a nullity, of little consequence in contrast to the sub-conscious interplay of drives and affects. One might reasonably wonder if these can be reconciled without Nietzsche being guilty of some egregiously misleading overstatement. Riccardi’s picture, however, promises a solution. Nietzsche, we are told, should be understood as a pluralist about consciousness. Riccardi disentangles qualitative and perceptual senses of ‘consciousness’ from the dominant sense addressed in GS §354. It is this dominant sense, which Riccardi identifies as reflective consciousness (‘Rconsciousness’), that is both overestimated and a danger. RConsciousness amounts to an idiosyncratic actualist higher-order thought (HOT) theory—a view on which something’s being conscious is a matter of its being the object of an assertoric thought. These claims then undergird the attribution to Nietzsche of epiphenomenalism about Rconsciousness.

This picture has considerable explanatory power. Regarding the ‘superfluousness’ of consciousness, when Nietzsche writes that we can “think, feel, will, remember, we could likewise ‘act’ in every sense of the word” without this entering our consciousness (GS §354), his point, on Riccardi’s reading, is that these can, and often do, occur absent accompanying HOTs (themselves causally impotent vis-à-vis action). The putative danger of such thinking concerns its reliance on the shared folk-psychology of given communities. In an illuminating section, Riccardi argues that Rconsciousness co-ordinates the psychologies of community members, endowing them with a “collective rationality” which embodies “the perspective of the ‘herd’ by which he means, roughly, the goals of socially selected drives the prevalence of which prevents the flourishing of human greatness” (96).

The final part of Riccardi’s book (Chapters 8–11) examines important topics in Nietzschean philosophical psychology using the resources limned in the preceding sections. Chapters 8–10 address the self, self-knowledge, and will, respectively. In addition to offering substantive, stand-alone interpretations, the chapters have a cumulative effect. The discussions turn in different ways on the separateness of the “drive constituted bodily self” (167) and the domain of reflection. Nietzsche’s positions, so understood, emphasize the limitations of Rconscious self-interpretation through which we come to think of ourselves as disembodied, conscious ‘I’s, as bearers of reflectively accessible states/attitudes, and as knowing, efficacious willers. Chapter 11, the final chapter prior to a short conclusion, connects the content of Riccardi’s book to Nietzsche’s dominant philosophical interest: value. Riccardi proposes an account of the essential features of Nietzsche’s ‘ideal type’, instantiated most notably in individuals like Goethe and Napoleon. Such figures evince three key features. In addition to widely-accepted claims that they are psychologically stable and unified, Riccardi argues that they are capable of value creation. These chapters illustrate an estimable feature of Riccardi’s book. Riccardi not only shows that Nietzsche held substantial views on issues familiar to analytic philosophers of mind, but also employs these resources to unpack some peculiarly Nietzschean topics deserving of wider engagement.

As with any book rich in original claims, there are parts of Riccardi’s book with which one might quibble. Riccardi’s overall picture, however, is elegant and textually well-supported. His book is assiduously clear, and so composed as to make evident the deep structural and philosophical connections between the psychological claims that suffuse Nietzsche’s works. Riccardi draws skilfully throughout on a mixture of contemporary work and historical sources. The book has much to offer those sympathetic to reconstructive history of philosophy as well as those who prefer more contextual approaches. Indeed, some of the most illuminating sections highlight Nietzsche’s engagement with his coevals. Riccardi illustrates superbly the influence of now-obscure figures, often drawing judiciously on Nietzsche’s notebooks to reveal points of concord and divergence. Nietzsche is shown to be neither isolated from, nor a mere conduit for, his intellectual surroundings. Instead, he is a receptive-yet-critical reader of what was often, at the time, pioneering work on the mind. Riccardi’s discussions of Georg Schneider, Alfred Espinas, and Théodule-Armand Ribot, in particular, are excellent, and make real contributions to our understanding of the development of Nietzsche’s thinking on drives, the self, language and consciousness, and the will.

To those familiar with Riccardi’s work, this will come as no surprise. Neither will the impressive range of recent scholarship on the mind that appears throughout this book. Here, however, I was sometimes less persuaded. This was particularly true of the chapters on consciousness. As stated earlier, Riccardi takes Nietzsche to hold a peculiar form of HOT theory. Standardly, on such views, a given state/content is unconscious until one has an unconscious HOT of the form, “I am in state M” or “I think that p”, etc., at which point the targeted state/content becomes conscious. Riccardi’s previous work drew attention to Nietzsche’s insistence that one “thinks constantly, but does not know it” and that the need to communicate one’s condition meant having “to ‘know’ what he lacks, to ‘know’ how he feels, to ‘know’ what he thinks” (GS §354) (see Riccardi 2018; 2016). Such remarks putatively reflect a picture on which consciousness of a first-order mental state requires that one self-ascribe it in higher-order thinking.

Despite the view’s aforementioned explanatory virtues, Nietzsche’s remarks rather underdetermine a standard HOT theory in its finer details, and diverge at crucial points (see Fowles 2019). ‘Consciousness’ in GS §354 appears to apply to something more restricted than on normal HOT views, and to involve conscious thoughts that are not themselves the targets of HOTs—viz., those that occur in natural language. Accordingly, Riccardi's book presents a refined hybrid HOT theory on which the correct understanding of Rconsciousness is disjunctive: a mental state is Rconscious if it’s (i) a language-mediated interpretation of an unconscious state, or (ii) targeted by such an interpretation. While this addresses some concerns about earlier HOT readings, I worry modifying the view to make the higher-order thinking intrinsically conscious is no costless move. It restricts the scope of Rconsciousness such that Riccardi’s picture appears too narrow to account for Nietzsche’s remarks. I also worry that in looking to read Nietzsche as a HOT theorist of sorts, Riccardi risks importing commitments absent from the texts.

Since it applies only to Rconsciousness, the hybrid view is, to borrow Ned Block’s label, a form of modest HOT theory. Modest views do not account for all consciousness by reference to higher-order thinking, just one kind or sense (See Block, 2011; cited by Riccardi 2021, 79). On Block’s original proposal, the modest theorist might fence off phenomenal consciousness and use HOTs to account for what’s left. The hybrid view is more modest still, concerning only episodes involving conscious thinking about one’s own states. Yet conscious thought extends well beyond self-directed thinking, as Nietzsche clearly recognized. The remarks in GS §354 that prompted the modification of the HOT reading make clear that conscious thinking alone “takes place in words”. Whatever differences there are between the thoughts, “I am in state M” and “Mattia is in state M”, they do not include only one of them being in words. Here, Nietzsche’s own metaphor for consciousness, that of a mirror, is preferable to the HOT theorists’ favoured image of the spotlight shining on one’s own states. A world-directed conscious thought might ‘mirror’ the content of, say, a perceptual state, but need not be about the state. There is no reason to think Nietzsche considers such thoughts to be unconscious. Even if GS §354 is primarily concerned with the phenomenon of self-consciousness, which it surely is, that doesn’t entail that this exhausts the sense(s) of consciousness found in the passage.

It’s not clear, however, that the hybrid view adequately captures even self-directed thought. One important overlap between Nietzsche and the HOT theorists, we’re told, is the supposed indispensability of first-person pronouns and self-ascription to their respective accounts of consciousness. A HOT, Riccardi states, “is always a first-person thought [. . .] all conscious states are unavoidably ascribed to a self” (172; see also 78). This claim makes perfect sense on standard HOT views as conscious states always bottom-out in unconscious thoughts connecting a copular verb or propositional attitude to an ‘I’. But if this higher-order thinking is intrinsically conscious, as per the hybrid view, the claim restricts the thinking involved in Rconscious episodes to thoughts of the appropriate form. Self-directed thinking, however, need not be first-personal. Thinking “that hurts!” surely constitutes a thought about one’s pain articulated in words, but involves no pronoun. First-personal self-directed thinking also need not be explicitly self-ascribing. Consider the examples Nietzsche himself offers of things one must be able to bring to consciousness, i.e., what one lacks, feels, and thinks. “What he lacks” in the original German is “was ihm fehlt”, more ploddingly translated as “what is lacking for him”. The first-personal assertoric statement, das fehlt mir, involves a dative indirect object pronoun (mir), which specifies the person in relation to whom something ‘does’ lacking. The sentence clearly concerns one’s condition, and would be used to communicate as much. But no mental state is self-ascribed (or even mentioned) in its linguistic content. Such a thought exemplifies consciousness of one’s condition as Nietzsche means it in GS §354, but is clearly not of the form, “I am in state M” or “I think/will/remember, etc., that p”. This problem arises directly from features of the hybrid view introduced to accommodate things Nietzsche says that don’t comport with standard HOT theory. To capture Nietzsche’s remarks, we need either to supplement qualitative, perceptual, and reflective forms of consciousness with something further, or to understand consciousness in GS §354 differently to Riccardi.

The hybrid view complicates several subsequent discussions. Consider Nietzsche’s putative epiphenomenalism, which Riccardi labels weak local epiphenomenalism (WLE)—‘local’ since it applies only to Rconsciousness, and ‘weak’ inasmuch as the claim is not that Rconscious states make no causal contributions, only that they are “never causally efficacious antecedents of token actions” (131). As it stands, this can’t be quite right. Affects become Rconscious if targeted by a HOT and are clearly involved in Nietzsche’s causal-psychological accounts of actions. On closer inspection, Riccardi’s position reflects the disjunctive structure of the hybrid view: an Rconscious state is (a) WLE-epiphenomenal if it fails to contribute causally to token actions, or (b) kind-epiphenomenal if being conscious adds nothing to its causal powers.

Let’s start with (b). Riccardi’s remarks leave it unclear whether, on the hybrid view, such episodes require an occurrent linguistically-articulated first-personal thought or simply that one have tokened a targeting thought about the relevant state. Regarding the first option, one might worry the resultant view is orthogonal to many discussions of epiphenomenalism. Staunch opponents of epiphenomenalism can allow that one needn’t be conscious in this sense for a state to be causally efficacious. If highlighting that anger is causal even when one is not thinking the words “I am angry” (or the like) were it sufficient to establish epiphenomenalism, the position would be uncontroversial. The second option, while not invulnerable to similar concerns, is more plausibly relevant to epiphenomenalism. It would represent, however, another departure from the HOT theories that purportedly overlap with Nietzsche’s, and requires further textual support.

Nietzsche’s alleged epiphenomenalism thus rests predominantly on (a), applied to things like Rconscious volitional thoughts. There is more to be said about this than I have room for here. The passages adduced by Riccardi demonstrate that Nietzsche takes conscious volitions to be insufficient for action, and that he denies direct causal connections between conscious thoughts, and between conscious thoughts and token actions. Nietzsche clearly also takes HOTs to be unnecessary for targeted states to have causal power. I was less persuaded by the stronger claim that intrinsically Rconscious thoughts never make a causal contribution to actions (even indirectly).[1] More importantly, given our focus, the strongest argument for attributing epiphenomenalism to Nietzsche relies on attending only to conscious thoughts, wholly side-lining the recognizably HOT-theoretic features of the hybrid view.

More generally, the insistence on reading Nietzsche through the lens of HOT theory (hybrid or otherwise) restricts Riccardi unnecessarily. The many persuasive interpretive positions in his book could have been woven into an even more powerful whole, absent its strictures. Nevertheless, Riccardi’s book is a rich and greatly rewarding study of Nietzsche’s account of the mind, and will doubtless shape subsequent work on the topic. And rightly so. Despite the odd disagreement, I learnt a great deal from the book. Riccardi’s combination of historically sensitive exegesis and able philosophical reconstruction has produced an impressive work that is a must-read for Nietzsche specialists, and will be of interest to anyone working on the topics covered therein.


Thanks are owed to Mattia Riccardi, Brian Leiter, Luke Davies, and Alex Prescott-Couch for comments on an earlier version of this review.


References to Nietzsche’s texts use standard English abbreviations, followed by chapter (where applicable) and section number (Arabic numeral): Beyond Good and Evil (BGE); Ecce Homo (EH); The Gay Science (GS); Twilight of the Idols (TI). Translations are my own.

Block, Ned. 2011. “The higher order approach to consciousness is defunct”. Analysis 71 (3), 419–431.

Deonna, Julien & Teroni, Fabrice. 2012. The Emotions: A Philosophical Introduction. London, New York: Routledge.

Fowles, Christopher. 2019. “Nietzsche on Conscious and Unconscious Thought”. Inquiry 62 (1), 1–22.

Hume, David. 1739/1967. A Treatise of Human Nature, ed., L.A. Selby-Bigge. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Katsafanas, Paul. 2016. The Nietzschean Self: Moral Psychology, Agency, and the Unconscious. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Leiter, Brian. 2019. Moral Psychology with Nietzsche. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Ribot, Théodule-Armand. 1883/1888. Les Maladies de la Volonté (5th edition). Ancienne Librairie Germer Bailliere & co.: Paris.

Riccardi, Mattia. 2016. “Nietzsche’s Pluralism about Consciousness”. British Journal for the History of Philosophy 24 (1), 132–154.

Riccardi, Mattia. 2018. “Nietzsche on the Superficiality of Consciousness”. M. Dries (ed.), Nietzsche on Consciousness and the Embodied Mind. Berlin: de Gruyter. 93–112.


[1] The same goes for Ribot, whom Riccardi links to Nietzsche’s views on willing and causation (195–198; 141). Ribot certainly makes strident claims about conscious volition and causation that resemble remarks from TI cited by Riccardi as evincing Nietzsche’s epiphenomenalism. Yet Ribot’s position is more nuanced than his rhetoric. He appears primarily concerned with attacking the “current doctrine” that conscious willing “is a fiat to which the muscles are obedient” (1883/1888: 13–14), i.e., that conscious volitions are direct, sufficient causes of action