Nietzsche's Psychology of Ressentiment: Revenge and Justice in On the Geneaology of Morals

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Guy Elgat, Nietzsche's Psychology of Ressentiment: Revenge and Justice in On the Geneaology of Morals, Routledge, 2017, 180 pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138724808.

Reviewed by Mark Migotti, University of Calgary


The analysis and diagnosis of ressentiment -- its nature and its effects on the history of Western thought (and Eastern thought too, for that matter) -- are at the heart of Nietzsche's contributions to philosophy. "The earth has been a madhouse", he says in the Genealogy of Morals [GM], and otherworldly philosophers, along with priests, theologians, and others, have played a large a part in making it so. Such claims demand rigorous scrutiny, so it's pleasing that in the book under review Nietzsche's account of ressentiment is carefully investigated and diligently analyzed.

As his subtitle indicates, Elgat's chief text is the Genealogy and his chief concern is the relationship of ressentiment to justice. Rich in detail, Elgat's discussions are nevertheless sharply focused on a core theme: that "Nietzsche's critique of morality is motivated by considerations of justice," his "main charge against ressentiment and morality [being] . . . their injustice" (p. 163). He expounds and defends this view in seven chapters, preceded by an introduction.

In Chapter 1, Elgat criticizes Eugen Dühring's and Robert Solomon's forced attempts to rehabilitate ressentiment by assigning to it an integral role in the genesis of a sense of justice, and in Chapter 2 he sketches a "minimalist" account of what ressentiment is. Chapter 3 takes up the injustice of ressentiment, and Chapter 4 turns to the first essay of GM in an effort to explain how "the same features that make ressentiment unreliable in matters of justice play a role in generating the self-deception required for the success of the slave revolt in morality" (9). Chapter 5 is explicitly cast as an interlude devoted to the relation of ressentiment to bad conscience, specifically to the idea that "it is the man of ressentiment who has the invention of bad conscience on his conscience" (p. 9). Chapters 6 and 7 complete the book's argument by, first, showing how slavish ressentiment manages to provoke a transformation of "justice on an elementary level" into a moralized notion "that bestows universal and equal extension to all the newly minted values of the slave revolt" (pp. 9-10); and then "reconstruct[ing]" on Nietzsche's behalf a "vindicatory genealogy of the capacity to be (non morally) just" (p. 10, emphasis added).

Elgat's focus on ressentiment and justice leads him to pay welcome attention to a number of underexplored passages in GM, and to address important difficulties faced by Nietzsche's views. But he sometimes misses nuances in Nietzsche's arguments, and often scants their context in the narrative of GM. For example, while (in my view) his minimalist interpretation of ressentiment is on the right track, his attempt at a rigorously neutral, "purely psychological" definition of ressentiment is open to criticism. Elgat's understanding of ressentiment is minimalist in the sense that it relies on a minimal number of presuppositions. Contrary to the suggestions, explicit or implicit, of many commentators, he denies that ressentiment is an affliction only of the weak or slavish, argues that it isn't necessarily motivated by a sense of injustice or a belief that one has been wronged, and maintains that it needn't fester or be repressed.

As Elgat interprets it, Nietzschean ressentiment is an "instinctive reaction" to suffering (of a certain sort). More compendiously, it is "an affectively charged desire for revenge that involves the belief that someone or other is responsible for the suffering that causes it . . . " (emphasis in original). To read this is to be reminded of Aristotle's definition of anger as "a desire, accompanied by pain, for conspicuous revenge for some conspicuous belittlement of oneself or one's friends and family, the belittlement not having been deserved" (Rhetoric 1378a 31-33), and this should give us pause. Anger is the signature emotion of the Homeric hero -- an emotion of strength (one might have thought) that typically expresses itself in plain, honest outbursts. But Nietzschean ressentiment is surely an emotion of weakness that typically (though not perhaps necessarily) expresses itself obliquely and deviously, that usually doesn't vent itself at once, but simmers and stews and festers.

In criticism of Robert Solomon's suggestion that ressentiment "arises out of the frustrated desire to take revenge for one's wounded self-esteem", Elgat objects that this would make "the psychology of ressentiment parasitic on the psychology of anger" (p. 28). In fact, he maintains, "anger plays almost no significant role in the Genealogy and is especially absent from Nietzsche's explanation of the slave revolt and the formation of the ascetic ideal" (p. 29). And Nietzsche takes smouldering, frustrated ressentiment to be "a special case" of the general phenomenon"; the man of ressentiment may be tormented by submerged ressentiment, but it doesn't trouble the noble warriors of GM I. To be sure, Elgat grants that "it is . . . when ressentiment gets frustrated (and consequently repressed) that its products are the most interesting, creative, and fateful" (p. 29) But he doesn't seem to realize that this concession makes all the difference.

When the violent nobles of heroic cultures experience ressentiment, they take action without a thought; they retaliate and move on. Primitive noble ressentiment has no "products" at all, unless you count the mistreatment of those foolish enough to infringe on the honour of archaic noble warriors. But when the slaves experience ressentiment, they can't respond in kind to the injury and humiliation that provokes it. Since they have to respond somehow, they brood. And their brooding leads to new ideas. The creativity of creative ressentiment is rooted in the capacity of lingering ressentiment to stimulate thought. While GM I's nobles are naturally healthy, the original slave moralists are sick, both of and from their ressentiment. The birth of slave values involves sickness begetting inwardness, which begets a topsy-turvy reinterpretation of sickness and health, according to which the weak and poor in body may be the rich and strong in spirit.

In a passage on which Elgat places due interpretive weight, Nietzsche invites us to observe "the way that ideals are fabricated on earth" (GM I 14). Noble ideals grew organically out of the life experiences of nobles, their victories and opportunities for adventure and prowess; but slave ideals had to be manufactured synthetically out of resentful misery and frustration. The original slave moralists turned psychological necessity into moral virtue; being meek anyway, they contrived to turn their meekness into a moral merit. And the "masterstroke" of this duplicitous operation, Nietzsche asserts, is the idea that what the resentful slaves seek is not vengeance, but justice. Nietzsche sees the reinterpretation of justice as the crowning indignity of the slave revolt in morality because, as Elgat says, it allows slave moralists to believe that they are motivated, not by "the spirit of revenge", but by "the passion of justice" (88). I agree, and add that this amounts to saying that the original slave moralists manage to transmute futile resentment into righteous anger -- so that Elgat himself implicitly acknowledges that the interplay between anger and ressentiment in Nietzsche's thinking is more complicated than he presents it as being. And when Elgat goes so far as to claim that "every act of revenge stems, at least partly from ressentiment" (36), I demur. "Never let an insult go unrevenged" is a maxim available only to those with a strong sense of honour and the wherewithal to enforce it. Those in such a position can get angry and then get even; those without such advantages have to cope with burgeoning ressentiment.

I have focussed on just one of the details in Elgat's rich picture that needs more work. But as I said, there is much in his book to learn from and admire, especially, in my view, the original and promising ideas he develops in his last chapter, concerning the role of justice as an epistemic or cognitive virtue in Nietzsche's philosophy. Though we still recognize justice of this sort in such expressions as "doing (or not doing) justice to a subject matter", it has received surprisingly little attention from mainstream philosophers generally, and interpreters of Nietzsche specifically. Here's hoping that the pioneering efforts found in these pages inspire at least the latter group to further work on the deep and subtle issues involved.