Nietzsche's Values

Nietzsches Values

John Richardson, Nietzsche's Values, Oxford University Press, 2020, 546pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190098230.

Reviewed by Alex Silk, University of Birmingham


John Richardson's book is the third installment in his trilogy on Nietzsche. And weighing in at just under a kilo, it is epic. (The kindle version is, I expect, lighter, but no less formidable.) I might have preferred it to be more like Die Hard.[1]

Parts 1–2 of the trilogy consider how various of Nietzsche's ideas can be systematized under a notion of will to power (Richardson 1996) and naturalized in a biology and psychology of drives (Richardson 2004). Part 3 also aims for systematization -- here, in light of Nietzsche's understanding of values. But, one might ask, what in Nietzsche could one not talk about under a heading of "values"? Nothing. Richardson is not unaware: "I've tried to show the full scope of Nietzsche's thinking about values, which, as the heart to his enterprise, required looking at pretty much all of his main philosophical topics and ideas" (525).

Brace yourself.

As expected, Richardson's command of Nietzsche's corpus is startling. The book contains three parts: Part I examines our basic "biological" (xiv) ways of valuing in drives and affects, common with other organisms (think: "life," "will to power"). Part II examines "our distinctively human way of valuing" (263) in language and society, shaped by self-conceptions as subjects and agents (think: "morality," "nihilism"). Part III examines the potential for a new "third way of valuing" (526), honestly informed by the sciences and unreservedly affirming of life (think: "value creation," "eternal recurrence").

What, then, is the core conception of "value" that unifies the discussions? There isn't one. First, as Richardson notes, uses of 'value' can be ambiguous between "descriptive" and "valuative" readings (2–3).[2] A speaker of (1) refers to things traditionally valued, and expresses that they aren't valuable (cf. GM.P:6).

(1) Traditional values are of no value.

Need such a distinction undermine a project on "Nietzsche's values"? Of course not. For instance, first, one might develop an account of the nature of valuing. Second, one might investigate how various causal factors have shaped what that attitude has traditionally been directed toward, in human beings (cf. a "genealogy of values"). Third, one might use the latter information in critiquing whether to continue valuing such things, and determining what to value going forward, and under what conditions (cf. a "revaluation of values"). Fourth, one might consider what would justify such a critique. Why, fundamentally, are these things worth valuing, and those things not? Because of facts about our psychology and evaluative attitudes (cf. Katsafanas 2013, Silk 2015)? Something else (cf. Schacht 1983)? Or is the question somehow confused (cf. Leiter 2002, Hussain 2007)?

This is not how the narrative of the book proceeds.

The "main argument" is that "Nietzsche calls us, above all, to experiment with 'how far the truth can be incorporated' " (283), particularly "the truth about ourselves and (especially) our values" (282). In one sense, such an argument might not seem difficult to make. Richardson is quoting Nietzsche. Behold, the man: "To what extent can truth stand to be incorporated? . . . that is the experiment" (GS.110); "we need to know the conditions . . . under which . . . values grew up, developed and changed" (GM.P:6), as "crucial" preparation "for a revaluation of all values" (EH.GM), the self-proclaimed "task" (EH.II:9) of Nietzsche's life. The book's "overall claim" presumably gets its teeth from what exactly the to-be-incorporated truth about our values amounts to. Richardson says: "that values are perspectival" (348). What does this mean?

Let's start with "values." A refrain is that values, for Nietzsche, are "signs by which we steer" (525). The discussion is, unfortunately, short on examples, but let's consider one. Suppose I have a drive for eating -- a "habi[t] of directed activity" (420) that is " 'plastic' toward its distinguishing outcome" (88) of consuming food. I regard some things as markers delineating a path for satisfying that drive -- say, the smell of a cookie; other things not so much -- say, garbage. My eat-drive values the cookie smell, in this sense, insofar as that smell is treated as a sign to consuming food, where "treating as a sign" is explained in dispositional terms (e.g., attention, motor responses, drooling). Achievement of the drive's goal is indicated by a "feeling of power" -- a "feeling of improving or extending" (109) the activity of eating. I smell a cookie; the cookie becomes salient; I draw near; I eat it; I feel power ("wham, take that!"); and the feeling of power disposes me to use other cookie-smells in pursuit of eating food.

So, on Richardson's interpretation, "a 'value' is essentially a sign used by a will or aiming" (xiii). Except it isn't. Later we learn that "We [value] not only in aiming" (115) and "steering toward goods (as in our drives)" (xiv), but also "passive[ly]" in "feelings and emotions," i.e., "affects" (115). Affects are understood, fundamentally, as "ways we 'feel' how well we're doing . . . in relation to drive-ends." My pleasure in eating the cookie is an "assessment . . . in feeling" (115) that I've been doing well consuming food.

What, then, are an affect's values? Chapter 4 "Affects" says: "an affect's values are . . . the growth or decline it feels." This might suggest that affects feel things (namely, growth/decline), and the things they feel (growth/decline) are their values. Indeed: "feeling feels itself affected either for better or worse" (119). I don't know what this means. Anger doesn't feel things; people do.

Even if it did, what would be the relation between drive-values and affect-values? If the "idea of values as signs" is what's "key" (xiii), what are an affect's values signs of/for/to? The Preface says: with affects, "We use [the world's impacts upon us] as signs . . . of how to feel that we are and have been growing -- or declining" (xiv). Assuming a sign of how to feel that P is a sign that P, an affect's values would be signs of growth or decline. So, the thought goes, a drive is a certain habit of directed activity, and a drive's values are the signs that guide it toward its goal; and an affect is a certain habit of feeling involving an assessment of drive success, and an affect's values are the signs that motivate that assessment.

Is this a correct generalization about values? If my jealousy is (something like) a feeling-assessment that my drive for outdoing others is doing badly, I could say that the jealousy's "values" include, perhaps, the look of "Alex: 5, Alice: 50" on a scoreboard and my raised blood pressure. But I wouldn't know what I meant or what it has to do with values -- things regarded as things to be promoted, or the like. Indeed at least half the features treated as "mak[ing] up the 'essence of values' " (14) don't apply with affects.

What about the claim that values are "perspectival" (according to Nietzsche)? Richardson characterizes it as a "fundamental metaethical" (439) claim about what "[is] valuable" (3).

The key point: values arise only by valuings . . . there is no "value in itself," . . . nothing has value . . . independently of its being valued . . . values are perspectival: they are or express the perspectives of the valuings they depend on. (14)

The positive "perspectivity" claim is clarified as that "Values are good because they're valued, and not vice versa . . . values [are] grounded in valuings" (8–9). I take Richardson to be ascribing to Nietzsche a familiar type of attitude-dependent metaethical view, that facts about values are grounded in facts about evaluative attitudes (as opposed to non-attitudinal natural or non-natural properties).

As Richardson says for Nietzsche, the view "is putty in his hands: it carries quite different force in different places" (445). Richardson notes that "perspectivist" (attitude-dependent) theories differ on how facts about what's valuable are determined by facts about valuings. He states that "Nietzsche rejects" the (implausible) view that "[a person] P's good" is "what(ever) P does value" (10). Yet elsewhere "his . . . perspectivism" is defined as the view that "A value is just the object of a valuing" (xiii), and we are told that "values are essentially perspectival (i.e., essentially 'valueds' . . . )" (260); "Power is good just because we value it" (298); "freedom is . . . a value," which "means . . . that it is really a valued," " 'merely' the object of a valuing" (327); life-affirmation is a "value-only-by-being-valued" (439); and "creating values" -- "the central topic of this book" (449) -- "is creating some new set of signs" (450) and "installing them as effective signs" (452), i.e., valuing them.

Richardson distinguishes his interpretation of Nietzsche's metaethics from Paul Katsafanas's (2013) constitutivist interpretation and Alex Silk's (2015) constructivist interpretation. Katsafanas's "Nietzschean Constitutivism" treats power as having a "privileged normative status" (2013: 4), as a standard for assessing actions, values, etc. What explains this privileged status is that "every action shares [power as] a common, higher-order aim" (2013: 238). Richardson objects that, for Nietzsche, power is valuable not because "we must value power," but because "we do" (34). However, later we are told that "we should value saying Yes because we already do and must value [power and truth]" (396; emphasis added). That aside, it isn't evident what would be at issue. It would be remarkable if every action just happened to aim at power. That is why Katsafanas argues that the reason every action aims at power is that power is a structural feature of action. Richardson agrees (294, 465). (Indeed Katsafanas (2013: 161) draws on Richardson 1996.)

Silk 2015 uses 'constructivism' for the thesis of attitude-dependence. The specific Nietzschean version of constructivism that's developed treats values as grounded in the evaluative attitudes of Nietzsche's "new philosophers" ("free spirits," "higher types") -- individuals who "achiev[e] Nietzsche's ideal of freedom . . . , with all the psycho-physiological, historical, and epistemic demands that it implies" (2015: 258–259). Richardson offers two objections. First:

I hear Silk's version of constructivism still to claim to constitute an external standard to which we all "ought" to align. But Nietzsche justifies his values by direct appeal to the values we already have . . . . The "ought" is supplied . . . by what the person values already. (34)

Silk doesn't interpret Nietzsche as providing "an external standard" applicable for "all." The values of higher types of individuals are determined by their attitudes. For the rest of us S, what's valuable is grounded in what the new philosophers would value conditional on being in S's situation and more limited perspective. "Given their genealogical insights, the new philosophers will . . . be better aware of how to integrate the lower types' drives and affects in ways that promote health" (2015: 261) and avoid toxic attitudes such as ressentiment. Oddly, chapter 11, "Creating", suggests such a view:

[Nietzsche] doesn't only mean to show how individuals should "create" new values for themselves. He also wants to "found" values as new norms for a new society -- for a new kind of herd. (xvi)

the herd doesn't see what's good for it. . . . the new "rulers" will . . . advance [the herd's] interests . . . by . . . giving it values . . . that aim members better at their own growth. (473)

Richardson's second objection is illustrative:

I don't think [Nietzsche] privileges [his own values] to the extent of thinking them "genuine" values, whereas values inherited or made by others . . . are not . . . All values are just as much genuine values, in Nietzsche's view -- in the "descriptive" view that is primary for him . . . They have all been "created" or "constructed" back through human history by innovating valuers. (34)

No one is denying that ordinary people have values in the descriptive sense (mentioned above). What's at issue isn't whether people's states of mind count as valuings, or what those states of mind are about. What's at issue is what's valuable, or what "signs" different people are "to steer by," and why. I don't know what philosophical issue would be at stake in asking whether the descriptive or valuative use is "primary," or has "priority" (6).

Here, as elsewhere, it can feel easy to lose track of what we're talking about. Key terms are used ambiguously (e.g., 'value,' 'create,' 'perspectivity, 'truth') or idiosyncratically (e.g., reserving 'true' for what's attitude-independently true). Commitments are presented inconsistently. And Richardson's own characterizations of what's at issue are potentially unreliable. It can feel a bit like reading Nietzsche.

The treatments of Nietzsche's evaluative views also raise difficulties. Chapter 9 tries to reconcile Nietzsche's ideal of a universal affirmation of life ("the Yes") with his elsewhere "highly critical stance" (355), which negatively evaluates things. Richardson responds by ascribing to Nietzsche a "value monism." The view isn't presented consistently. First: "all things are . . . good intrinsically"; "Everything is (truly) good. Bad is simply a kind or degree of good" (362, 372). Being on a scale that orders items by how F they are doesn't make something F. One doesn't get to be tall just by getting measured. Later: "What [Nietzsche] claims to be true is not that all things are good"; "the value is not the first-order 'goodness of everything,' but the (act of) valuing things so" (397, 395). This isn't a view that value is monistic. It's a view that valuing monistically is valuable.

Such gymnastics are unnecessary. One alternative: 'Good' is a relative gradable adjective. In general, being ADJ, for a relative gradable adjective 'ADJ', is meeting a certain standard of ADJ-ness. What standard is relevant can vary across contexts (e.g., Kennedy 2007). If I say 'Paul is tall' at a family reunion where everyone is under 5'6", and later say 'It's too bad Paul isn't tall' at the gym when he's picked last for basketball, I needn't have contradicted myself. Suppose in Nietzsche's "Yes"-moments, the standard for goodness is nil; any degree or expression of life suffices to count as good (effectively using 'good' as a minimum standard adjective). In such contexts, one could truly affirm, for "each thing" (361) x, 'x is good'. And yet, in "everyday use," one might "go on" (377) and truly say, for some such o, 'o isn't good; o is bad'. Indeed, Richardson characterizes the evaluations as "operating in" different "context[s] or situation[s]" -- one "reflective" "in which we 'look back' . . . and assess [something]," the other "prospective . . . in which we assess what's to be done" (396).

This interpretation has the advantage of being coherent. It's also compatible with Richardson's insights on the "Yes"-context's role "in cultivating a certain state of feeling" (354). If I want to be life-affirming but implicitly harbor ressentiment, my concrete situation may not determine a standard such that I could truly say, for "this particular, detested thing" (362) o, 'o is good'. Habituating a frame of mind that can actually determine a "Yes"-context may plausibly influence one's "everyday" evaluative practices. It might lead to caution in simply judging things "bad," as doing so may dispose one to ignore their good-making features (notably, their expression of life). It might even promote caution in simply judging things "good"; in ignoring distinctions among the equivalence class of things meeting the standard of goodness in the context, attention may be detracted from ways they could be improved. Given our profound tendencies to simplify our judgments, an attack on "opposite values" (BGE.2, 47; HH.107) might seem in the offing.

Chapter 12 examines Nietzsche on the role of religion in incorporating the life-affirming ideal. Richardson agrees that Nietzsche thinks "gods aren't real" (487). The discussion considers instead how, for Nietzsche, " 'having' a god" (487) might be "a matter of willing" or "feeling," rather than "belief" (486–488). Incompatible pantheistic, polytheistic, and metaphorical views are ascribed to Nietzsche. It's hard to respond without knowing what's at issue -- e.g., Nietzsche's views on the nature of religious attitudes; whether Nietzsche believed in god; whether Nietzsche's attitude of amor fati constitutes a religious attitude; or whether Nietzsche accepted that certain religious attitudes or practices can be valuable for certain people. The difficulty isn't ameliorated by the suggestion that Nietzsche accepted attitude-dependence about god -- "that any gods are perspectival, too -- are constituted by our human views of them. Gods, like values, are ideal not real" (476). One can have beliefs about things whose existence is grounded in human attitudes.

Richardson characterizes the "book's overall theme" as Nietzsche's "task to incorporate the perspectivity of values" (506) -- the "fundamental metaethical truth" (439) that "values [are] grounded in valuings" (9). Need the book stand or fall with the metaethics? Oddly no. Only one of the twelve "principles from the study of values" introduced in chapter 1 is on metaethics. The concluding "In lieu of a conclusion" doesn't mention it.

We noted above that sentences such as 'values are perspectival' are ambiguous. It might be used to make a metaethical claim about the attitude-dependence of value. Alternatively, it might be used to make a (dare I say "genealogical") claim about our situatedness and the spectrum of biological, psychological, social, historical factors shaping and being expressed in our evaluative attitudes. Indeed:

A value, remember, is a sign to steer by . . . . But now why does the living thing so use that sign? . . . . In the [case of values acquired "passively,"] the value will be . . . a part of "my perspective," but it will also, and more tellingly, express the perspective of the will that set this sign up. It expresses that will's aims and interests and not my own . . . . We've seen how our new and improved human sciences will expose these other perspectives . . . But now, . . . when I try to "incorporate" such a truth, . . . I'm brought up short. The recognition that this value expresses the aims and interests of some "other" disrupts this valuing . . . in order to face this perspectivity and still value, I must make it the case that my values express my own perspective. (430–431)

It's here that the book is at its best.

I conclude with a brief overview of the other chapters. Chapter 2 provides a naturalistic account of the sense in which all life values power. Power is understood, not fundamentally as overcoming resistances, but as a "process of growing in control" (57). Life also becomes "(the gist of) what's valued" (39), insofar as power is a "way of 'increasing life' " (56).

Chapters 3–4 develop Nietzsche's account of our "overall psyche," "understood as a system of drives and affects" (146). The discussions on naturalizing the intentionality (goals, functions) of drives are characteristically rich. Things get weird when turning to relations among drives and the relation between drives and affects, but that is perhaps unavoidable. (The proliferation of scare quotes, particularly around intentional vocabulary, doesn't help. Chapter 3 features nearly 200 uses of scare quotes. The chapter is 34 pages long.)

Chapters 5–7 examine Nietzsche's genealogical critiques of concepts of agency, subjectivity, and truth. Richardson interprets the Genealogy Essay II as offering a practical commitment account of personal identity: being " 'the same person' " across time is a matter of binding oneself and "taking-oneself-bound" (193) to commitments. "This complex capacity to promise and commit oneself" (193) underpins our agency, necessary for social and moral norms. A guiding theme is the profound influence on our explicit values and moral concepts in the service of social ends, often counter to our "bodily valuing" (296), individual interests, and health.

Chapters 8–12 reconstruct Nietzsche's positive evaluative vision in response to nihilism: the task of incorporating life-affirming values, informed by an honest, rigorous pursuit of truth. The discussions of the proper relation between individual and society provide a welcome counterpoint to interpretations emphasizing Nietzsche's more individualistic, "self-isolating" strands. More explicit statements of what must be the case to count as achieving freedom and selfhood would be helpful.

Dropping the treatments of the metaethical issues might incur a moderately less "systematic" denouement to the trilogy. But it would free up space for developing with greater depth and care Richardson's main insights on "Nietzsche's . . . picture of the world and of us (humans) in our relation to it" (ix) and what in that picture may be worth preserving (perhaps even setting up a Part 4?).


I use the following standard abbreviations for Nietzsche's texts: Beyond Good and Evil (BGE); Ecce Homo (EH); Human, All Too Human (HH); On the Genealogy of Morality (GM); The Gay Science (GS).

Hare, R. (1952). The language of morals. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Huddleston, A. (2014). "Nietzsche's meta-axiology: Against the sceptical readings". British Journal for the History of Philosophy 22: 322–342.

Hussain, N. J. (2007). "Honest illusion: Valuing for Nietzsche's free spirits". In B. Leiter and N. Sinhababu (eds.). Nietzsche and morality. Oxford: Oxford University Press. 157–191.

Katsafanas, P. (2013). Agency and the foundations of ethics: Nietzschean Constitutivism. New York: Oxford University Press.

Kennedy, C. (2007). "Vagueness and grammar: The semantics of relative and absolute gradable adjectives". Linguistics and Philosophy 30: 1–45.

Leiter, B. (2002). Nietzsche on morality. London: Routledge.

Lyons, J. (1977). Semantics. vol. 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Richardson, J. (1996). Nietzsche's system. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Richardson, J. (2004). Nietzsche's new Darwinism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Schacht, R. (1983). Nietzsche. London: Routledge.

Silk, A. (2015). "Nietzschean Constructivism: Ethics and metaethics for all and none". Inquiry 58. Special issue: Nietzsche's moral psychology. 244–280.

Silk, A. (2018). "Nietzsche and contemporary metaethics." In P. Katsafanas (ed.). The Nietzschean mind. New York: Routledge. 247–263.


[1] 'Die Hard' is being used metonymically (twice removed). Thanks to a reviewer.

[2] The distinction has been noted under various descriptions in diverse areas. Richardson cites Huddleston 2014, Silk 2015, 2018; cf. Hare 1952, Lyons 1977.