Nihilism and Philosophy: Nothingness, Truth and World

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Gideon Baker, Nihilism and Philosophy: Nothingness, Truth and World, Bloomsbury, 2018, 239pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350035188.

Reviewed by Robert Wicks, The University of Auckland


The title of Gideon Baker's book is sufficiently broad to stimulate a variety of expectations. Given the theme of nihilism -- a concern potentially for everyone -- one might suppose that it would be easily accessible by a general audience, or to a philosophically educated audience (widely considered) to encourage reflection upon "meaning of life" issues that arise in the face of our uncertainty about the nature of the universe and our place within it. Since the word "nihilism" frequently invokes a reference to the Russian nihilist movement of the 1860s, or to Ivan Turgenev's novel, Fathers and Sons (1862), one might also expect some discussion of nihilism as it appears in 19th century Russian thought.

This is not exactly what we find. A review of the chapter titles conveys its contents more accurately: (1) "The True World", (2) "Cynic Nihilism", (3) "Paul's World" (as in St. Paul), (4) "Paul: Nihilist or Overman?", (5) "Nietzsche's World", (6) "Heidegger's World", (7) "Parrhēsia". The study appears in the Bloomsbury Studies in Continental Philosophy series and is significantly informed by Heideggerian thought. If one is not familiar with Heidegger's manner of writing and thinking, there will be a number of opaque passages.

Here is an example of the expositional style. It is from the chapter entitled "Heidegger's World," where the intention is to describe Heidegger's view of "world" and to link it informatively with some earlier discussions:

And that which lies together in the form of the 'as,' in the form of a relation to beings as a whole, is world: 'The question of how things stand regarding being cannot be posed without asking about the essence of the "as," and vice-versa' (1995: 334). We can see in all this how Heidegger keeps his earlier reflections on Paul in mind. The primacy of the logos -- of the propositions 'is' and 'is not' -- established by Greek philosophy was tied up with the invisibility of the 'as' of world. But if metaphysics from Aristotle fatefully steered the question of Being towards the 'is' (1995: 323), then in Paul the more original 'as' comes to light. Paul's comportment towards beings in the form, not of the 'is' and 'is not,' but rather in the form of the 'as not' (hos me), enables them to appear differently. In Christ, slaves become free men and free men slaves. (p. 169)

Here is another excerpt to convey the expository style. This is from "Paul: Nihilist or Overman?", when Giorgio Agamben's view is being presented:

Agamben finds further support for his thesis that the messianic vocation negates this world without positing a world to come (or, more precisely, that in negation the world to come is already here) in the Pauline notion of messianic time. Agamben argues (2005: 62) that messianic time is neither this eon (world) nor the coming eon; neither chronological time nor the apocalyptic time of the eschaton (the end of time). Messianic time is rather an 'operational time,' 'the time that time takes to come to an end' (2005: 65, 67). It is seized kairos (occasion or opportune moment), which is itself nothing other than seized chronos (sequential time), and this is its relation to the 'as not,' which, as revocation, as deactivation, is nonetheless active, a vocation (2005: 69, 68). This operational time is not to be added as a supplement to chronological time (as, for example, in Marxism, which, following Hegel, views redemption as the final result of a historical process), which is why Paul's parousia (presence) should not be understood as 'second coming' but rather as the relation of the Messiah to each instant of chronological time (2005: 756, 101, 70-71). (p. 141)

The foundation of the book's substance is presented in "The True World", a title inspired by Nietzsche's short presentation in the Twilight of the Idols (1888), "How the True World Finally Became a Fable" (Wie die "wahre Welt" endlich zur Fabel wurde). The focal point is Plato's division between the timeless, unchanging world of being and the fluctuating world of becoming -- a division that defines a metaphysical stance that, according to Baker, opens the door to nihilism. The claim is that: the "loss" of the world of becoming as the (once) true world as it assumes a subordinate position to the world of being, is "the condition of nihilism" (p. 24), and that consequently "nihilism is wrapped up in the two-worlds problem" (p. 24.) The remainder of the book reviews a series of ways to reaffirm the spatio-temporal world by abandoning the idea of a timeless "true world" in view of the leading assumption that this conception of timeless truth precipitates nihilism:

The attempt to think truth and world as other than given in the true world is why we are interested in the image of the world as it appears in the writings of Paul, Nietzsche, and Heidegger in particular. In their different ways, each of these connected figures of Western thought denied the existence of a true world, of an unchanging truth of the world, and instead struggled to conceive of truth in the world. Indeed inasmuch as they hold the true world to be nihilism, both Nietzsche and Heidegger are descendants of the Pauline break with the cosmos. (p. 93)

Some of the phrasing here is unconventional, as when we read that the "true world" can "be" nihilism. In another passage, we are referred to "Paul's nihilism towards the Roman Empire" (p. 130), where "nihilism" means "adamant denial of the validity of an established world view." One could consequently speak about Nietzsche's "nihilism" towards Christianity, or Marx's "nihilism" towards capitalism, and the like. The word "philosophy" (see below) similarly has a non-standard meaning in this study. The word "nihilism" appears as such in connection with perceiving individuals such as Paul as superior creators of value who propose new ways to interpret the world, where the established way's plausibility is seen to be in its death throes.

With respect to the book's theoretical foundation and Nietzsche's position in "How the True World Finally Became a Fable," Nietzsche does indeed present the "two-worlds problem" as problematic and objectionable. He also firmly believes that Platonism is debilitating to one's health. Nihilism in general, though, does not issue exclusively from Platonism, as Baker maintains. Nietzsche himself, in The Birth of Tragedy (§3) (1872), identified ancient Greek nihilistic attitudes that predate Platonic metaphysics in the "wisdom of Silenus" -- a mythological episode that Sophocles described in Oedipus at Colonus. Nihilism is independent of postulating a world of eternal truths that renders the spatio-temporal world into a realm where absolute truth cannot reside. Meaninglessness is the keynote of nihilism, and a single, material world that is inherently devoid of value can equally precipitate nihilism. A cold, impersonal, materialism might even be more debilitating, since it admits no further metaphysical dimensions into which one's hope might be projected.

Baker asserts that "the question of nihilism, of the nothing (nihil), is always a question of truth" (p. 4). It might, though, be more effective to say that the question of nihilism is always a question of value. Nietzsche -- and he seems to be correct here -- signals this when he states that nihilism arises when "the highest values devalue themselves" (The Will to Power, §2).

One can also wonder whether assigning a secondary place to the spatio-temporal in relation to the Platonic, non-spatio-temporal, true world must lead to such an extreme consequence, namely, nihilism. Admitting that the spatio-temporal world takes a secondary place does not imply that the spatio-temporal world has no value. It may not have an intrinsic value, but as implicitly noted, it has an instrumental value as a realm that can inspire an awareness of what resides timelessly beyond the ordinary world.

Accompanying Baker's assumption that the "two worlds" problem is the source of nihilism is the claim that "propositional truth," "truth as correspondence," "metaphysics," and "philosophy," understood to be synonymous with traditional metaphysics (this is the meaning of the word "philosophy" in the book's title) are to be rendered suspect. Baker presents this group as a nexus of concepts that issue from the Platonic, otherworldly "true world," and that are consequently complicit in the nihilistic mentality. The proposed cure to nihilism, speaking generally, is to devalue these concepts in favor of reinstating a reverence for the spatio-temporal world in conjunction with a primary attention to humanistic, existential concerns that subordinate propositional truth to a kind of "lived" truth, or what it is to live "truthfully." One can recall here Kierkegaard's preference for "truth as subjectivity," which was offered in the same spirit.

When framed in this way, the book's orientation becomes recognizable: it is the same therapeutic and commendable one that motivates (1) Nietzsche's ambivalence towards Socrates as a representative of excessive, debilitating rationalism; (2) Heidegger's attack on inhuman attitudes towards inanimate nature that regard it as merely a set of objects to be exploited; (3) existential psychology's resistance to regarding people with psychological difficulties as basically diseased brains; (4) Derrida's critique of logocentric views that aim to scrub away metaphorical thought for the sake of precision and objectivity; (5) Lyotard's critique of knowledge as performativity as one-sided; and so on.

Baker's particular solution is to challenge the primacy of truth as correspondence, propositional truth, "metaphysics," and "philosophy," in favor of a different kind of truth, namely, "courageous truth telling" or parrhesia. This is to adopt an attitude of fearless speech: it is a way to conduct one's life by speaking openly, being true to oneself, "speaking truth to power," and consequently to live authentically.

The parrhesiast constitutes himself as a subject of truth through the retroactive effects of an enunciation that both determines and changes his very being. He will be the one who took the risk of telling the truth, but what that risk will make of him is still to be seen. Foucault finds in this free relation to becoming the living of Nietzsche's sense of truth (2010 66). (p. 214)

The parrhesiast is described here as a person who tells the truth, but it would be more accurate to say that parrhesiast is a person who says what she wholeheartedly believes is the truth. The distinction is significant. Consider the trial of an unrepentant Nazi, who, when giving testimony to explain his actions as an accused war criminal, makes no excuses, and courageously "speaks to truth to power" as he understands the situation, fully aware that the death penalty awaits. He defiantly recites a set of doctrines that he is convinced are true and to which he has devoted his life, but which are actually implausible. The person may be strong, authentic, dutiful, and honest with himself and everyone else, holding nothing back. But neither is his "truth" true in the propositional sense, and neither -- this reader submits -- should this kind of "lived truth" be elevated to a position that downplays and distains the objective ground that propositional truth offers.

Herein -- at least with regard to Baker's parrhesiastic solution to the existential problems that pure scientism generates -- resides the questionability of the set of fundamental prejudgments towards traditional metaphysics that motivate the book. The parrhesiastic attitude has its virtue, for instance, in how it can foster a truth-seeking philosophical attitude, but there are other ideals of character, and sometimes the truth is too true to be said. At one point, Nietzsche mentions what he considers to be a nobler attitude:

It is nobler to declare oneself wrong than to insist on being right -- especially when one is right. Only one must be rich enough for that. (Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Part One, "The Adder's Bite")

This review has focused critically on Baker's basic assumptions and central claims, most of which did not persuade me. It should be said that the book contains an abundance of substantial expositions that convey positions held by Agamben, Badiou, Bultmann, Foucault, Heidegger, Nietzsche, and Spinoza, usually as related to alternative conceptions of "world." The chapter "Paul: Nihilist or Overman?" (originally published as "Paul and Political Theology: Nihilism, Empire, and the Messianic Vocation" in Philosophy and Social Criticism, Vol. 41) is valuable in its presentation of different understandings of St. Paul, as expressed by Nietzsche, Taubes, Badiou, and Agamben. The interpretive diversity is astonishing, and it compares with the contrasting presentations of Nietzsche and Socrates with which interpreters have to contend.