Nineteenth Century Philosophy: Revolutionary Responses to the Existing Order

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Alan D. Schrift and Daniel Conway (eds.), Nineteenth Century Philosophy: Revolutionary Responses to the Existing Order, 317pp., vol. 2 of Alan D. Schrift (ed.), The History of Continental Philosophy (8 vols.), University of Chicago Press, 2010, 2700pp., $800.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226740461.

Reviewed by Frederick Beiser, Syracuse University


Volume 2 of the new eight-volume series The History of Continental Philosophy, which is edited by Alan Schrift and Daniel Conway, is devoted to nineteenth-century philosophy between 1840 and 1900. This volume, like others in the series, is aimed at both specialists and beginners who need an overview and introduction to a specific topic. There can be no question that the volume succeeds, at least to some extent, at its prescribed task. Most of the essays in this volume, especially those by Terrell Carver, F.C.T. Moore, Alastair Hannay and Alan Sica, provide useful introductions to particular thinkers and developments in nineteenth-century philosophy.

Yet it must also be said that the success of this volume is very limited. It provides introductions and surveys only for someone who works within the standard curriculum of nineteenth-century philosophy, i.e., for what is now taught in Anglophone universities and what is now discussed in academic journals. But it does not even begin to supply an accurate or adequate knowledge of philosophy in the nineteenth century. The problem here has nothing to do with the editors themselves, still less with the authors who have written for them, but it has everything to do with the standard curriculum, which adopts assumptions about what is of historical and philosophical significance about the period (1840-1900) that cannot survive serious scrutiny. If our curricula are to be true to history -- if they are to preserve what is actually of greatest historical and philosophical significance in this period -- they stand in need of drastic revision.

All would have been well if Conway and Schrift had self-consciously intended to follow the standard curriculum and if they were quite clear about this in the beginning. They would be above criticism if they made no pretense to provide knowledge of nineteenth-century philosophy itself. Unfortunately, this is not the case. In his introduction to this volume Conway writes that it "charts the most influential trends and developments of European philosophy in the tumultuous period 1840 to 1900" (p. 1). It is just this claim that is problematic. If we take a broad historical perspective of this period, and if we focus especially on German philosophy, which was decisive for the century as a whole, then "the most influential trends and developments" were the following: the materialism controversy, the rise of historicism, and the emergence of neo-Kantianism, especially the formation of the Southwestern and Marburg schools. None of these developments are even mentioned in this volume. The standard curriculum does not cover these trends and developments; and so the editors have removed them from history itself.

To get a clearer idea of the historical shortcomings of this volume, we only need to consider those themes the editors themselves regard as central and decisive. Conway states that the unifying theme of this volume is "the revolutionary fervor that alternately reformed, structured, interrupted, fragmented and guided the development of European philosophy in the period 1840-1900." By this "revolutionary fervor" Conway means, in part, that inspired by "the political struggles of the 1840s" (p. 5). If we take Conway at his word here, it becomes clear that he has not considered, let alone covered, crucial figures, themes and developments. The most important representatives of such revolutionary spirit in Germany were the materialists, particularly Ludwig Feuerbach, Ludwig Büchner, Heinrich Czolbe, Jakob Moleschott, Karl Vogt and Ernst Haeckel. While Feuerbach is treated in this volume (in a perfunctory and derivative essay by William Roberts), none of the other materialists are even mentioned. Yet it was precisely these figures who were behind the materialism controversy of the 1850s, which, by all accounts, proved to be the decisive intellectual controversy of the second half of the nineteenth century. (Neither Feuerbach, who stood on the sidelines, nor Marx, who was in exile, took part in this controversy).

The materialism controversy was as important for German philosophy in the late nineteenth century as the pantheism controversy in the late eighteenth century. The position of every philosopher was determined by where he stood in this controversy. It was the very touchstone of whether a thinker was for or against the cause of modernity. Vogt, a brilliant polemicist who was the leading spokesman for the materialists, presented his generation with a drastic dilemma: either a leap of faith in God, providence and immortality or a complete scientific materialism. All philosophy after 1852, which marks the beginning of the controversy, was a response to Vogt's dilemma. To have some idea of the influence of the materialists in the nineteenth century, one only needs to ponder that Büchner's Stoff und Kraft went through no less than 21 editions! It was Vogt, Büchner and Haeckel, not Marx (as Terrell Carver's article in this collection makes clear), who formulated, promulgated and popularized materialism in the nineteenth century. They were the force behind "the revolutionary fervor" of the epoch, and they were indeed a major challenge to the established order. Yet Conway and Schrift have nothing to say about them.

All intellectual historians agree that the rise of historicism was one of the most important intellectual developments of the nineteenth century. It was not for nothing that the century was known as "the historical age." For Friedrich Meinecke, one of the greatest historians of the epoch, historicism was indeed nothing less than "an intellectual revolution", one of the greatest since antiquity. That the editors have not covered this development, or even mentioned it, has much to do with popular misconceptions about it. For many, historicism just means the growth of historical scholarship and historical ways of thinking. But historicism was much more than this; it was indeed an essentially philosophical movement, one whose purpose was to legitimize history as a science. Historicism was first and foremost an epistemological enterprise, an attempt to justify the possibility of historical knowledge. This was indeed "a revolutionary development", in the broad sense intended by the editors, because it broke with the classical paradigm of knowledge as demonstration. Since Plato and Aristotle, the paradigm of knowledge had been based on mathematics, and it demanded nothing less than universal and necessary validity. The problem faced by the historicists was then to legitimate knowledge of the singular and contingent events of history. The effort to explain and justify that possibility involved many thinkers in the nineteenth century, among them Ranke, Droysen, Dilthey, Windelband, Rickert, Simmel and Weber. It is another notable instance of the historical weakness of this volume that historicism is not covered at all. There is a useful article by Sean Wilson on the hermeneutics of Schleiermacher and Dilthey; but hermeneutics is only one partial movement within historicism as a whole, of which the general meaning and problems are not discussed at all.

It is also a grave omission of the editors that they have not included a single article about the growth of neo-Kantianism. This probably has something to do with the neglect of this movement in the standard curriculum and something to do with the popular misconception of the neo-Kantians as mere epigones of their master. It is necessary to recognize, however, a basic and indisputable fact: that neo-Kantianism, for better or worse, was the most widespread and influential development in Germany philosophy from the 1840s to 1900s. Its influence spread far beyond the borders of Germany, and it was crucial for philosophy in Britain and the U.S. By the 1890s, the Marburg school of Cohen, Cassirer and Natorp, and the Southwestern school of Windelband, Rickert and Lask, had become the dominant philosophical schools in Germany. Someone might object that the neo-Kantian conception of philosophy was not original, having its source and inspiration in Kant. But the neo-Kantians were not mere followers of the Kantian letter; and one could make Windelband's famous dictum a motto of the movement as a whole: "Kant verstehen, heißt über ihn hinausgehen!" In their re-interpretation of Kant, the neo-Kantians developed an original and powerful philosophical position that has to be taken into account in any survey of the nineteenth century. We must not forget here that nineteenth century philosophy was very much a story about the re-discovery and interpretation of Kant, whose philosophy was revived precisely because it seemed the most plausible solution to the dilemma posed by the materialism controversy.

It would be nice to end my complaints about the historical omissions of this volume here. Nothing less than historical justice demands, however, that I add another example. Indisputably, the two most important philosophers in mid-nineteenth century Germany were Adolf Trendelenburg and Hermann Lotze. For nearly forty years, they held chairs in the most prestigious universities in Germany -- Trendelenburg in Berlin and Lotze in Göttingen -- and in that role they exercised an enormous influence upon philosophy in Germany and, later, in the U.S. and Britain. Trendelenburg was the teacher of Hermann Cohen, Wilhelm Dilthey and the American philosopher Henry Morris; and his impact upon Kierkegaard is well-known. Among Lotze's students were Wilhelm Windelband, Gottlob Frege and Franz Brentano. Furthermore, the two most important philosophical books of the mid-nineteenth century were Trendelenburg's Logische Untersuchungen and Lotze's Mikrokosmus. Trendelenburg was a crucial figure in bringing philosophy away from speculation and closer toward an investigation of the logic of the sciences. (This had little to do with positivism, as assumed by Dale Jacquette in his article in this volume). Lotze was a central force in developing a conception of truth, validity and value that played a crucial role in the struggle against naturalism and that had a decisive influence on early twentieth-century philosophy. Given the profound influence and importance of Lotze and Trendelenburg, no history of nineteenth-century continental philosophy can be complete without at least one article devoted to them. This would have been very helpful for many who have probably heard about them but are likely to know little about them.

The editors might grumble here that in chiding them for not including Trendelenburg, Lotze and the neo-Kantians I have not judged them by their own criteria. For their volume is meant to describe "revolutionary responses to the existing order", and Trendelenburg, Lotze and the neo-Kantians were not revolutionary; indeed, they represented the establishment and existing order, given their opposition to materialism and given their ensconced place in German university life. It is precisely here, however, that it is necessary to raise questions about the editors' criteria and their guiding themes of "revolutionary responses to the existing order." That theme is so vague and equivocal that it signifies contradictory viewpoints. The revolutionary response to the existing order can mean the revolution on behalf of modern values by Feuerbach, Marx and the German materialists; or it can also mean the reaction against modern values by Kierkegaard, Dostoyevsky and Nietzsche. The existing order can be pre-secular, non-liberal and monarchical society prior to 1848, the remaining traces of the ancien régime; and it can also be the more secular, liberal and democratic order circa 1870. The editors never spell out this ambiguity; they simply exploit it, so that they have a convenient device for including everyone according to the exigencies of the standard curriculum. But it is necessary to question whether the criteria, the guiding conception in forming this volume, are even coherent.

Behind the editors' theme of "revolutionary responses to the existing order" there lies an old myth, one that the editors have scarcely articulated yet tacitly adopted: namely, that the important philosophy of the nineteenth century came not from "academic philosophers" but from the radical individual thinkers outside the university, viz., from such solitary thinkers as Kierkegaard, Dostoyevsky, Nietzsche and Schopenhauer. This myth was very much advocated by these thinkers themselves, who declared that they, unlike their academic counterparts, were not in thrall to the governments who employed them, and who claimed that they alone were free-thinkers ready to challenge the moral, religious and social status quo. Since the academic philosophers only defended that status quo, so the story goes, they have little to say to anyone today, for whom the moral, religious and social values of the nineteenth century have lost all credibility. It is indeed largely because of this myth that the standard curriculum has become what it is today, and that it continues to prescribe our conception of nineteenth century philosophy.

The editors' tacit faith in this myth would explain why they give such importance to Nietzsche, Kierkegaard and Dostoyevsky in their volume, and why they omit academic philosophers like Trendelenburg, Lotze and the neo-Kantians. Yet it should be evident that this myth is a self-serving stereotype having little basis in fact. Some of these academic philosophers were indeed conservative in their moral, political and social views (viz., Lotze and Windelband), but others were very liberal and progressive (viz., Trendelenburg, Rickert and Cassirer), and still others on the far left as champions of socialism (viz., Cohen, Natorp). The source of this myth is Hegel's, Schelling's and Ranke's defense of Prussia, but this cannot be generalized for every academic philosopher. Not the least troublesome aspect of this myth is that some of these so-called revolutionary thinkers were themselves deeply reactionary. It is only by turning a blind eye to Nietzsche's reactionary politics and to Kierkegaard's and Dostoyevsky's fundamentalist Christianity that it is possible to make them relevant to us today. Any impartial contemporary student of nineteenth-century philosophy who knows the movement in all its breadth will find Cohen, Simmel and Weber more sympathetic company than Kierkegaard, Nietzsche or Dostoyevsky.

But even if we accept this myth, it still does not give us a good history of nineteenth-century philosophy. The absence of any coverage of the materialism controversy, historicism and neo-Kantianism are major lapses for any book claiming to cover all the major developments of nineteenth-century philosophy. The only excuse for such omissions must be that the editors wanted to provide introductions and surveys for those who follow the standard curriculum, for those who want to know about what is now taught in Anglophone universities and what is now discussed in contemporary journals. If they had limited their ambitions to such a pedagogic task, which is worthwhile in itself, there would be no reason to complain. But they have accepted the standard curriculum as if it provided a complete account of the philosophical history of the period, so that their volume, in the editors' words, "charts the most influential trends and developments in European philosophy in the tumultuous period 1840-1900". Again, it is this claim that cannot be sustained in any accurate assessment of the philosophically important developments of the nineteenth century.

One would have hoped that the purpose of a volume like this one would be to get beyond the standard figures, cliches and steretotypes about the nineteenth century, that it would broaden our historical and philosophical horizons, and introduce us to the new, extraordinary and unfamiliar. The blurb for this series indeed claims that it does just that. But it really does nothing of the kind, keeping its readers firmly in the grip of the standard curriculum.

There is an important methodological lesson to be learned here. Any historian of philosophy who wants to provide a survey and introduction to a broad historical phenomenon like the nineteenth century must learn to think outside and beyond the standard curriculum. Who and what is intellectually important in that century is not something given for the scholar; it cannot be the starting point of his investigation; rather, it is precisely the goal and object of all his research, the final fruits and ultimate result. To get there, the scholar must go beyond contemporary interests and concerns, delve into the past in all its breadth, depth and strangeness, reading unheard of texts and studying strange and forgotten controversies. It is only after a thorough study of the past for its own sake that the scholar is in a position to know who and what in the past is still of importance for us today.

Let me put the point this way. There are two kinds of philosophical historians: derivative and original. While the derivative follow the standard curriculum, the original have the powers to reform and create a new curriculum. It is the ideal and obligation of every genuine philosophical historian to be original, to get beyond the standard curriculum, to resist the pressure of pedagogical interests and intellectual fashions, so that he can give an accurate account of the depth and breadth of an historical period. No period of the philosophical past stands in more need of an original historian than nineteenth century philosophy. The standard tropes and figures do no justice to its depths, riches and powers. The ultimate purpose of this review is to give the reader some indication of how we must strive to get beyond them.