No Morality, No Self: Anscombe's Radical Skepticism

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James Doyle, No Morality, No Self: Anscombe's Radical Skepticism, Harvard University Press, 2018, 238pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674976504.

Reviewed by Jennifer A. Frey, University of South Carolina


In the 20th century, Elizabeth Anscombe was one of the most influential women working within the analytic philosophical tradition. But, according to James Doyle we have failed to understand her most significant contributions, and, as a result, have failed to take the full measure of her continued relevance and value. In particular, Doyle argues in his book that we have not fully reckoned with her two most radical theses: (1) that there is no sense whatsoever to be made of a distinctively moral use of ought, duty, or obligation, and (2) that ‘I’ is not a referring term. Although I take issue with Doyle’s claim that Anscombe is a radical skeptic — either about morality or the self — his rich and complex discussion of Anscombe’s notoriously difficult and penetrating essays rewards careful reflection.

Doyle begins by noting that Anscombe’s essay, “Modern Moral Philosophy” (MMP), has, despite its manifest influence, been systematically misunderstood. According to his interpretation of MMP, Anscombe is a radical skeptic about morality. To assess this claim, we need to understand the target. First and foremost, what is morality? Doyle seems to refer to a cluster of related claims: (1) the term is given and refers to a sui generis concept or category of reasons, values, motivations or principles; (2) the term is distinct from the ethical, which concerns the sphere of human action generally; (3) the term purports to have something like the status of a natural kind; for instance, it has no history, only various historical manifestations; (4) the term fixates on a specifically categorical form of demand. As a corollary to (1), we might add that moral reasons, motives, criticisms, and considerations are (a) distinct from other categories, such as the aesthetic or the prudential, and (b) are typically thought to be entirely independent of the contingencies of desire.

A few points of clarification are in order. Doyle thinks we can (and must) have duties and obligations, principles, and reasons for actions as part of our account of how to live well; but what we cannot have (and should not seek) is an account of moral duties, obligations, principles, and reasons. It is morality talk he wishes to dispense with. Doyle does recognize innocuous uses of “moral,” but nonetheless thinks the word is “so hopelessly compromised” that it is best to abandon its use entirely (10).

Doyle notes that the standard reading of MMP is deeply mistaken. It goes like this: Once upon a time, we employed a legitimate concept of moral obligation and duty; this concept was tied to belief in an authoritative lawgiver — it was intelligible within a “law” conception of ethics. Then we stopped believing in God, or stopped believing that belief in God should play a grounding role in moral theory, yet we couldn’t shake the sense that we were categorically bound to act (and not act) according to certain norms. We should recognize that a formerly respectable notion of moral obligation and duty is now deeply suspect, and therefore ought to be abandoned.

The main thrust of Chapter Three is to convince us that this is not what Anscombe meant when she wrote that, “the situation, if I am right, was the interesting one of the survival of a concept outside the framework of thought that made it intelligible” (MMP, 6). Doyle wants to say that the “concept” referred to in this oft-quoted passage is not that of moral obligation, but of “a conception of the fundamental form of ethical necessity as being categorically bound or obliged” (38). Morality talk aspires to be a version of this necessity but fails, since such necessity depends essentially upon the existence of a divine legislator who can place legitimate demands of obedience on us.

The crucial interpretive mistake, according to Doyle, is to identify this “ethically sovereign ought” with what we now call moral obligation or morality. The notion of morality, he argues, cannot be tethered to divine command; it is an intrinsically secular concept. To see that morality was never tied to divine command, let alone legitimated by it, consider the fact that moral requirements purport to have a sui generis force so authoritative that the edicts of any actual or possible legislator are automatically subject to it. Morality determines whether God’s commands are moral, and whether we are morally required to obey them.

The concept “moral” only arises, according to Doyle’s reading of MMP, because there was a notion of an “ethically sovereign ought” at the heart of the “law” conception of ethics that we never fully exorcised from our consciousnesses; however, in a secular context this holdover “is doomed to fall into nonsense,” and of course did fall into nonsense when it was transmogrified into the so-called moral ought (41). And so, talk of what is morally wrong is senseless; moral is not a legitimate concept but merely a term that, as Anscombe notes, “is the heir of the notion ‘illicit’ or ’what there is obligation not to do; which belongs in a divine law theory of ethics” (MMP, 17).

Now, if this is right, then morality is not a preexisting concept suddenly deprived of its legitimacy by the abandonment of belief in divine authority; it is a new concept generated by that very abandonment. Furthermore, it is a failed, fake, or pseudo-concept, because it has no intelligible intension. That is, it is not a concept like phlogiston, which fails to have an extension in the actual world, or an inconsistent concept that fails to have an extension in all possible worlds. More dramatically, it fails so miserably as a concept that it cannot be said to be in the business of determining an extension at all.

Such skepticism about morality is indeed radical, but is it Anscombe’s position? I am not wholly convinced. I want to agree with Doyle that Anscombe does not suppose that the ancients and medievals had our modern concept of morality, and that the differences here are deep enough that the standard reading of MMP is incorrect. And I further want to agree with him that modern morality is a concept best abandoned if we can manage it; it does far more harm than good. But I am not sure I would go so far as to say that it is literally nonsense, and I don’t think that Doyle has done enough work here to establish this maximally contentious claim.

As Doyle describes it, morality is a concept that fixates upon a sui generis, non-natural, and categorical sort of demand; a demand that simultaneously depends on a divine legislator and rules out such dependence. At best, though, this shows the weaker claim that the concept is inconsistent such that nothing could or does fall under it. But it doesn’t show that “morality” fails to be a concept-word that could figure in our thoughts or facilitate inferences. And in fact, it is unclear how that much stronger claim could be established. Doyle wants to say, drawing on Anscombe, that our talk of modern morality is like talk of criminality outside any possible system of criminal justice, or talk of ‘strikes’ and ‘outs’ outside of any baseball context that could give them a possible sense. But whether or not that is, in fact, the case, seems to hang on Anscombe’s contentious and all-too-brief genealogy of morals — a genealogy that Doyle has further expounded in interesting ways, to be sure, but more work would need to be done to show that it is an accurate description of how we got to where we are.

Nonetheless, despite my reservations about the radical nature of his skeptical view, I think that Doyle has done a tremendous service by pointing to the differences between our modern use of morality and some of its earlier uses. If we look to someone like Thomas Aquinas, we see just how modern our morality talk is. As Doyle points out, for Aquinas, human action just is moral action. What Doyle does not say, but which is true for Thomas, is that it does make sense for Thomas to speak of a distinctively moral domain: the moral domain is that of human choice, or that over which we exercise our rational dominium or mastery, which is extensionally equivalent to the sphere of what can be brought about through the joint exercise of our practical reason and will (ST I-II Q6). Talk of morals for Aquinas, then, is just talk of human action simpliciter, of freedom and personal responsibility, of what we do (and don’t do) that can be praised or blamed, and of what might incur the guilt (culpa) of sin. This concept of moral picks out a space in which one strives, through the use of one’s reason, towards one’s ultimate, naturally ordained end: happiness. All reasons, principles, and motives for acting, on such a view, are moral. If we try to impose our modern talk of morality upon Aquinas’s ethical writings, we are bound to distort it in profound ways. I further agree with Doyle that a similar point can be made about Aristotle. It is important to see this, as it lends some credence to a general skepticism about modern moral discourse’s claim to universality and necessity.

Doyle is right that skepticism about modern morality will put a great many philosophers out of business — including modern virtue ethicists who seek to show that the virtuous person acts for moral reasons, as well as modern philosophers of religion who seek to prove that God is perfectly moral. Since I share this skepticism about modern morality, I believe this would be a welcome advance.

In the second half of the book, Doyle turns his attention to Anscombe’s second radical thesis: that ‘I,’ despite its surface grammar which indicates that it is a singular term that a person uses to refer to herself, is not a referring expression at all, and speakers do not employ it to knowingly and intentionally refer to themselves. Doyle’s work here is not expository; he doesn’t need to convince anyone that this radical position is Anscombe’s view, as this was never contested. So, while Part One was largely exegetical, Part Two is more constructive; Doyle wants us to see that Anscombe’s main argument against the commonsense view cuts very deep.

In particular, Doyle zeroes in on what he calls the circularity argument. Anscombe argued that any account of ‘I’ as a referring expression is bound to be problematically circular, because it will include in its scope varieties of self-reference other than that distinctive of the correct use of ‘I,’ or, in seeking to rule out these wrong sorts of self-reference, will end up having to invoke the special sort of self-reference that is distinctive of our deployment of the ‘I’ concept, which it was supposed to explain. Doyle goes on to show that prominent solutions to the circularity problem simply do not manage to avoid it.

Doyle is at his most ambitious when he attempts to provide his own account of ‘I’ that is non-referential. Here he departs from Anscombe, because he doesn’t see in her view a positive account at all. Doyle’s own account takes ‘I’ sentences to be expressions that draw attention to the speaker and her condition (along the lines of Wittgenstein’s analysis of emotive expressions of pain). The role of these sentences is not to refer to an individual, namely oneself, and describe how that referent is by means of a predicate; they are merely expressive acts that allow others to validly judge that certain conditions truly hold of the speaker. The subject predicate structure of ‘I’ sentences is something we impose on the underlying expressive acts in order to integrate them into the larger inferential patterns we make concerning third personal, referential judgments for which this grammatical structure is appropriate. On this view, ‘I’ is understood

not as a singular term but as the surface trace of a second-level concept or quantifier. This logical form is clothed in the surface grammar of a predication with ‘I’ as subject for the sake of a massive gain in convenience in the regimentation of inference. (145)

Whatever one makes of this proposal, it is important to note that it strays very far from the grammatical account of the first-person pronoun Anscombe does, in fact, provide in her work on intentionality. As I (along with Christopher Frey) have argued elsewhere,1 what Anscombe counsels resistance to, in her essay, is the temptation to treat intentional subjects as a special class of objects, because doing so ignores the distinctive variety of self-awareness that intentional acts generally afford, and this is the very thing that cries out for philosophical explanation.

In our preferred reading of Anscombe on the first person, ‘I’ is a grammatical concept that captures our understanding of what it is to be the subject of intentional acts and actions generally. What Anscombe wants us to see is that intentional subjects are not a special kind or class of object, and so our understanding of ‘I’ does not involve an ability to refer to special objects. Our grasp of ‘I’ is evidenced by our ability to answer questions about, say, what one is doing, or what one perceives. When one competently answers these questions, one does not refer (or even purport to refer) to anything. Instead, one demonstrates grammatical understanding of an intentional act’s or action’s formal structure — the formal unity of subject and object in an intentional act/action. What it is to be a subject or object is exhausted by the grammatical position or role each occupies within this structure. So the grammatical concept we employ through our uses of ‘I’: (i) indicates the grammatical position subjects occupy vis-a-vis objects within intentional acts/actions, (ii) reflects one of the basic varieties of first-personal and non-evidential awareness available in intentional acts/actions, viz. self-consciousness, and (iii) is the common possession of those who can competently participate in the shared practice of asking and answering questions about intentional acts and actions. This view preserves Ansombe’s skepticism that ‘I’ is a referring term, but more importantly, shows that Anscombe does have her own account of the self or intentional subject — she is not a radical skeptic about it in the least.

Although I am not convinced of Doyle’s most ambitious claims, his book is a tremendous contribution to our understanding of Anscombe. It deserves to be widely read and discussed.


Thanks to Chris Frey, John Schwenkler, and Sergio Tenenbaum for helpful discussion of this material.

1 Christopher Frey and Jennifer A. Frey, “G.E.M. Anscombe on the Analogical Unity of Intention in Perception and Action,” Analytic Philosophy 58 (3), September 2017, pp. 202-247.