No Religion Without Idolatry: Mendelssohn's Jewish Enlightenment

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Gideon Freudenthal, No Religion Without Idolatry: Mendelssohn's Jewish Enlightenment, University of Notre Dame Press, 2012, 332pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268028909.

Reviewed by Benjamin Pollock, Michigan State University


Moses Mendelssohn is not who we thought he was.

This is the surprising but compelling message Gideon Freudenthal conveys in his exciting new book, No Religion Without Idolatry: Mendelssohn's Jewish Enlightenment. Mendelssohn is not a mere popularizer of the metaphysics of Leibniz and Wolff. He is not a mere apologist for Judaism. He is not a "philosophical hypocrite" who changed his views as the context demanded. In sum, Mendelssohn is not the admittedly important Enlightenment public figure but soft Enlightenment thinker we've come to know, who was somehow granted honorary "philosopher" status over the centuries, perhaps as acknowledgement for the fact that he was such a nice Enlightenment guy.

Freudenthal's book introduces us to a Mendelssohn who is a serious, consistent, and careful philosopher, an independent thinker whose true philosophical position has gone unappreciated for too long. The centerpiece of the book is a fresh account of Mendelssohn's philosophy of religion, and of his philosophical defense of Judaism in particular. But Freudenthal grounds this new account of Mendelssohn's philosophy of religion in an equally new account of Mendelssohn's general philosophy. In Freudenthal's reconstruction, Mendelssohn the philosopher has three basic commitments. He is committed to common sense, or "sound reason," as the human being's primary access to necessary truths; he is committed to a notably limited and cautious employment of speculative metaphysics; and he is committed to semiotics as a means of uncovering the ways -- and the limitations and dangers inherent to the ways -- we articulate and communicate our beliefs and judgments.

It is largely thanks to Freudenthal's sensitivity as a reader of Mendelssohn and his patience and deftness in reconstructing Mendelssohn's thought against the grain of Mendelssohn's standard reception, that the reader comes to see these three commitments as aspects of a single compelling philosophical view, which Mendelssohn brings to bear consistently on his disparate philosophical concerns. The reader who buys into Freudenthal's new depiction of Mendelssohn reaps considerable philosophical payoff by book's end. On its basis Freudenthal is able to explain numerous aspects of Mendelssohn's thought -- many of which have remained at best curiosities until now -- as part and parcel of a coherent philosophical outlook. Freudenthal draws compelling insights from Mendelssohn's thought about the role of philosophy in religious life, moreover, that have real relevance today. Towards the end of this essay, I will raise some questions about Freudenthal's Mendelssohn. But there is little doubt, it seems to me, that Freudenthal's book will be a paradigm-shaker in Mendelssohn studies, and that it will breathe new life into contemporary discussions about enlightenment and religion.

In the book's first chapter, Freudenthal introduces his provocative account of Mendelssohn the philosopher. According to Freudenthal, Mendelssohn's first philosophical loyalty is to sound reason or common sense, through which human beings have access to basic truths necessary for human life. Mendelssohn's trust in sound reason is the basis for what Freudenthal deems an "optimistic view of human knowledge and reason" (25), according to which rational, empirical, and commonsensical avenues to truth stand in a "wonderful harmony" with one another, and even with the moral and aesthetic goods of human life. Mendelssohn only turns to metaphysics, Freudenthal suggests, to systematize the knowledge to which we have access through common sense; and to defend the truths of common sense against skepticism. But according to Freudenthal, Mendelssohn is also deeply skeptical about metaphysics itself, because of the way he understands human thought to be bound up with language. Language may be completely appropriate to designate the objects of sensory experience, but when it seeks to describe that which transcends experience, language can only function metaphorically. The problem, Freudenthal has Mendelssohn explain, is that when philosophers engage in rational speculation, they are inclined to forget the metaphorical character of their language-bound thoughts, and to confuse the ideas they have conjured up for knowledge. Thus, Mendelssohn advises, if speculative metaphysics is to remain on the path to certain knowledge, it must ever orient itself through common sense. When it is found to deviate too severely from those truths we have access to through common sense, we have a clear indication that speculation has led us off course.

Freudenthal's second chapter offers a brief sketch of the philosophy of Salomon Maimon, and from this point forward, Maimon serves as Mendelssohn's foil in the book. Although Maimon's repeated appearances begin to wear by book's end (much as Maimon must have worn on Mendelssohn himself, come to think of it), more often than not, references to him in the book are helpful and illuminating. By juxtaposing Mendelssohn's moderate philosophical standpoint, grounded in common sense, to Maimon's extreme rationalist and skeptical leanings, Freudenthal is able to make a strong case for Mendelssohn's independence and uniqueness as an Enlightenment thinker. The comparison also yields the added benefit of showing that Enlightenment Jewish philosophy was anything but monolithic.

In the book's third chapter, Freudenthal begins the process of showing how Mendelssohn's philosophy of religion emerges neatly and consistently out of his general philosophical predilections. Although there may be a small role for the metaphysician in the religious context "in forging proofs to fend off the skeptics and sophists" (78), Mendelssohn finds the essential pillars of natural religion -- "the belief in God, providence and the afterlife" -- to be accessible to learned and unlearned alike through sound reason or common sense. Moreover, Freudenthal shows, Mendelssohn argues that a religious insider's assent to the historical truths of a revelatory tradition is based on a "trust" in the authority of the witnesses of that tradition which parallels, on the scale of the particular religious community, the trust in common sense shared by human beings universally. Since it is always reasonable for us to trust our own traditions more than those of others, Freudenthal has Mendelssohn explain, we can equally grant that members of other religious traditions act reasonably in preferring their own historical truths and beliefs. Mendelssohn's own profession of allegiance to Judaism and yet of tolerance for religious others -- for which he has often been maligned as inconsistent or opportunistic -- is rooted, Freudenthal elegantly explains, in this "epistemic pluralism" that grasps how trust works in the communal context.

The heart of Freudenthal's book, chapters four through six, addresses Mendelssohn's preoccupation with symbolic representation and, on the basis thereof, presents an original and highly engaging account of Mendelssohn's philosophy of religion, in general, and of Judaism, in particular. While the beliefs of natural religion may well be accessible to sound reason, Freudenthal shows Mendelssohn was keenly aware that articulating such beliefs for oneself and communicating them to others requires that these beliefs be represented. On Freudenthal's reading, Mendelssohn understands religious communities as forming around different symbolic systems that represent, firstly, the truths of natural religion, and secondly, the respective defining characteristics of the communities themselves. In its purest, most transparent form, Freudenthal explains, a symbol allows us to look through it and to see the transcendent object the symbol stands for. But in the context of religious life, symbols cannot be transparent: the very concreteness of their objectification of divinity is what gives them the power to awaken religious feeling among community members. As Freudenthal adeptly shows, this central problem that Mendelssohn highlights within religious life parallels the problem of linguistic representation that he identified in metaphysics. Just as metaphysicians tend to reify the metaphors through which they direct their sights towards speculative truth, so religious practitioners tend to forget the way religious symbols are meant to point to the divinity that transcends them, and wind up worshiping the symbols themselves instead of the divine. The result? Idolatry.

Idolatry, on Mendelssohn's view, is an ever-present fixture of religious life. More than any other religious community, however, Judaism, Mendelssohn believes, is equipped to combat idolatry. It is in this context, thanks to his examination of Mendelssohn's semiotics, that Freudenthal is able to shed remarkable light on his philosophical defense of Judaism. The way Freudenthal applies Mendelssohn's understanding of symbols to a wide range of Jewish religious practices in this section is simply superb, and it yields numerous pearls of insight. Let me highlight, in particular, two episodes in Mendelssohn's account of Judaism that Freudenthal helps us to understand. The first is Mendelssohn's rather infamous claim that Judaism is not a revealed religion that commands particular beliefs other than in the rational truths of natural religion, but rather is a revealed legislation, whose "ceremonial law" is designed to organize communal practice in such a way as promotes the celebration of and inquiry into the truths of reason. Freudenthal here shows how Mendelssohn's understanding of Judaism follows directly from his concern with religious symbols. Unlike concrete objects, ceremonial practices "are transient and leave no permanent objects behind that are conducive to idolatry" (138). As a result, Mendelssohn is able to argue that precisely those Jewish practices that enlightened Christians found least reasonable are part of a system of religious representation that directs Jews towards the truths of natural religion and protects them -- and perhaps others as well -- from falling into idolatry.

The second episode from Mendelssohn's philosophical defense of Judaism that Freudenthal's account illuminates so nicely is the curious discussion of hieroglyphs in the middle of the second part of his Jerusalem. Mendelssohn's claim, in this context, that the ambiguity of hieroglyphic writing is the cause of idolatry has so baffled readers, that the foremost Mendelssohn scholar of the last generation, Alexander Altmann, declared it "the least substantiated of all theories he ever advanced." But on the background of Mendelssohn's semiotics, Freudenthal shows the link between pictographic representation and idolatry to be quite compelling. He even shows the sin of the golden calf to exemplify, on Mendelssohn's interpretation, the human tendency to forget the transcendent objects to which linguistic symbols refer, and to treat the symbols themselves as objects of adoration.

The seventh chapter of Freudenthal's book examines Mendelssohn's attitude towards idolatrous trends in the Judaism of his own time (see: Kabbalah), and it also brings Mendelssohn's semiotics to bear on his political philosophy. Mendelssohn has long appeared to have been inconsistent in his claims about the power and authority of religious institutions; indeed, in the second part of Jerusalem he appears to defend his prior call to circumscribe the power of contemporary Jewish authorities with an account of original Judaism as theocracy! Here too, the insights Freudenthal draws from his study of Mendelssohn's semiotics are striking.  On his view, Mendelssohn is consistent throughout his career in suggesting that a Mosaic constitution in which God alone rules -- and in which, therefore, church and state are one and the same -- represents the ideal Jewish polity. It is just that since contemporary Judaism no longer lives according to the Mosaic ideal, it must conduct itself differently. The fall from this ideal occurred, Freudenthal shows Mendelssohn held, when the Jewish people called for the establishment of a worldly kingship, preferring a concrete manifestation of political power to divine rule (leading to the anointing of Saul as king). As Freudenthal shows, Mendelssohn thus views the separation of church and state within Judaism as the result of the very same propensity to idolatry that Judaism was intended to combat!

In Mendelssohn's eyes, Judaism represents a religious community designed to ward off idolatry. And yet, as examples stretching from the Biblical account of the golden calf to Mendelssohn's own time show, those who would remind their fellow-Jews that the object of their worship should be the God knowable through sound reason fight a constant battle against the tendency to idolatry within Judaism itself. In Mendelssohn's thought, Freudenthal explains, Judaism thus comes to exemplify the ever-present struggle between enlightenment and idolatry inherent to -- and, as Freudenthal argues, even constitutive of -- all religious life. In the last chapter of the book, Freudenthal draws a number of thought-provoking conclusions from this idea. Perhaps most suggestive is the claim that the individual person's potential for enlightenment in fact depends on the presence of idolatry within her community, without which she would lack the resistance required to spur her to that inquiry which alone would lead her to make knowledge of necessary truths her own. Hence the title of Freudenthal's book, No Religion without Idolatry, designates, according to Freudenthal, "not only a curse but also a blessing: it is a necessary condition for the ever active quest for truth and enlightenment" (200-1).

As I've tried to convey, Freudenthal's book is a truly exciting contribution to Mendelssohn scholarship. It offers an original picture of Mendelssohn as an independent philosopher, and it explains -- in some cases for the first time -- how disparate and oft-maligned aspects of Mendelssohn's thought hold together as part of a coherent and compelling philosophical view. Freudenthal's foray into Mendelssohn's semiotics breaks new and important ground in understanding Mendelssohn's account of Judaism, and his argument about the complementary roles enlightenment and idolatry serve in religious life should enliven contemporary discussions in the philosophy of religion.

I do however want to raise a set of related questions about Mendelssohn's general philosophical position and his account of religious enlightenment as Freudenthal presents them. Recall that Freudenthal suggests, first of all, that Mendelssohn "believed in common sense and was a skeptic about metaphysics" (21). Here I want to pose a question: Is Freudenthal's Mendelssohn equipped to respond to radical skepticism regarding those necessary truths to which we have access through common sense and for which metaphysics seeks demonstrations? As often as Mendelssohn may have dismissed those he branded "skeptics and sophists," Freudenthal rightly points out that in texts stretching from On Sentiments and the Phaedon to Jerusalem and the Morning-Hours, Mendelssohn regularly hints at his own bouts of skeptical worries regarding the very truths of natural religion without which he declared life would not be worth living. Now, so long as one is in a trustworthy mood, I propose, Mendelssohn's view as Freudenthal presents it works just fine: the harmony between what one judges true based on common sense and what one demonstrates as true based on rational argument allows a person to approach certainty. But what is to be done in response to radical skepticism regarding truths necessary for human flourishing? Freudenthal's Mendelssohn appears to answer as follows: when skepticism arises in the face of the weakening of commonsense beliefs, seek out the demonstrations of speculative metaphysics; when skepticism arises in the face of speculation gone awry, return to the firm, trustworthy ground of common sense. If this is indeed Mendelssohn's view, then it is hard not to suspect some sleight of hand. Mendelssohn then comes across a bit like the dealer of a game of three-card monte who is able to move the "grounds for knowledge" card deftly between one cup and the next. The skeptic playing along might not be able to discern where to direct his questions; but this doesn't mean his questions have been answered. For what happens, one is still inclined to ask this Mendelssohn, if I can trust neither common sense nor the demonstrations of metaphysics?

I am convinced by Freudenthal's claim that Mendelssohn's philosophical position is composed of common sense, some speculative metaphysics, and semiotics. But the problem of skepticism is one reason I'm inclined to think that in pushing against the grain of Mendelssohn's reputation as a Wolffian rationalist, Freudenthal has pushed a bit too far, and has overstated Mendelssohn's ambivalence with regard to metaphysics. Despite his awareness of the limitations of language and of the tendency of metaphysics to go astray when not oriented by common sense, Mendelssohn still appears to hold that demonstration is the surest means for the human being to overcome the threat of skepticism. I would suggest, then, that Freudenthal can't be exactly right when he says, "whenever possible, Mendelssohn wishes to demonstrate the truths of religion philosophically, but their truth and a person's knowledge that they are true do not depend on these philosophical underpinnings" (29). For the question is precisely whether a person's commonsense "knowledge" that the truths of religion are true can be trusted as knowledge. Mendelssohn pursues demonstrative arguments in metaphysics throughout his career at least in part, it seems to me, because it is only through the help of such arguments that one can decide whether or not one's commonsense "knowledge" is worthy of the name. Thus, while the periodic demand that the speculative thinker orient herself through a return to the truths of common sense ensures that the thinker proceeds with great care in pursuit of rational demonstration, it surely doesn't reveal the whole pursuit of metaphysics to be beside the point.

I think Freudenthal's downplaying of Mendelssohn's commitment to metaphysics is evident in his otherwise masterful account of Mendelssohn's views on enlightenment and religion, as well. The task of the enlightener in the religious community, Freudenthal suggests, is to provide a counterweight to idolatry, reminding the community of the basic truths to which religious symbols point (alongside the historical truths of the community). Here too, it seems to me, metaphysics plays a role in Mendelssohn's account that Freudenthal understates. For Mendelssohn, the proper, enlightening enactment of the "ceremonial law" is not only intended to remind members of the religious community about the truths of natural religion available to them through common sense; but rather it also aims to awaken those who are suited for it to pursue that intellectual perfection possible for human beings that comes, at least in part, through speculative metaphysics. Freudenthal may be right to claim that for Mendelssohn, metaphysical arguments are not necessary to ground the beliefs of the unenlightened; but -- we might add -- neither are they a matter of indifference to the enlightened.

Such questions about Mendelssohn's attitude to speculative metaphysics should find a place, it seems to me, in the discussions about Mendelssohn's thought Freudenthal's book is certain to generate. It is one of the book's great virtues that it reopens for debate the question of the basic character of Mendelssohn's philosophical commitments, and how these commitments determine his views about religious life.

Mendelssohn is indeed not who we thought he was. And we are indebted to Freudenthal's book for challenging us to rethink Mendelssohn's philosophical project and thereby to rethink the relevance Enlightenment philosophers may still have today.