Nominalism about Properties: New Essays

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Ghislain Guigon and Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra (eds.), Nominalism about Properties: New Essays, Routledge, 2015, 217pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138849938.

Reviewed by Bryan Pickel, University of Edinburgh


In some cases, the application of a common word to various objects lacks any foundation in the nature of the objects, as when many people share the same name. In other cases, the application seems to be explained by a similarity residing in the objects. Some figures are referred to as 'maroon' or 'hexagonal' in virtue of sharing a color or shape, respectively. Similarly, some particles are referred to as 'electrons' in virtue of deeper scientific similarities such as their charge and mass. Realists about universals hold that these similarities in nature are to be explained by a common element present in each of the objects. Thus, the maroon things are similar to each other because there is a common color universal in each of them.

By way of contrast, nominalists deny that there are universals. The eleven essays of Nominalism about Properties provide critical discussion of forms of nominalism and the challenges they face. The volume includes an introductory essay by Ghislain Guigon and Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra, four essays focusing on the development of nominalism in the history of western philosophy, and six discussing contemporary forms of nominalism.

The essays are easy to read. Each covers a topic in a comprehensive manner without ever feeling overly long. A number of them would serve well as background readings in an undergraduate class on metaphysics as they provide highly accessible entry points into debates over universals that require little background knowledge of the literature. In the historical section, Paolo Crivelli's essay on Aristotle's definitions of universals in De Interpretatione and John Marenbon's discussion of Abelard would be especially appropriate for this purpose. In the contemporary section, A. C. Paseau's "Six Similarity Theories of Properties" is well suited to pedagogical purposes. Paseau develops a variety of forms of resemblance nominalism, the view that similarities in nature are to be explained by the fact that various particulars are similar to each other. He clearly explains the various ways in which the notion of 'similarity' has been formulated and develops standard and novel objections to each form of resemblance nominalism with the help of diagrams.

Some of the papers naturally complement one another. A pair of papers by Guigon and Douglas Ehring addresses problems for nominalists that arise from coextensive predicates. Another pair by Nicholas Mantegani and Joseph Melia focuses on methodological issues pertaining to nominalism. For reasons of space, I will focus on these four.

Coextensive predicates raise problems for forms of nominalism that attempt to explain an object's exhibiting a certain feature in terms of the object's membership in a class of particulars. The problem is that a single class of particulars might be unified by more than one commonality. For example, everything of a particular shade of maroon might be hexagonal and all hexagons might be of this shade. A realist would describe this as a situation in which objects in a single class are similar in two respects: they share a color universal and a shape universal. The realist would go on to say that this shared extension is contingent; in other possible worlds, an object in this class might fail to exhibit the shape or the color universal.

But nominalists in question offer to explain the possession of both features in terms of membership in the same natural class. Guigon develops this worry as a problem about meaning. Pre-theoretically, the sentences 'o is maroon' and 'o is hexagonal' are not synonyms even if it turns out that all and only maroon things are hexagonal. Yet, his nominalist attempts to "analyze" these ascriptions as asserting, respectively, the proposition that o is one of the maroon things and the proposition that o is among the hexagons. Guigon's nominalist is also an extensionalist, holding that these propositions are identical if the maroon things are the hexagons.

Thus, Guigon's nominalist identifies the propositions expressed by the sentences 'o is maroon' and 'o is hexagonal'. But he argues that the pre-theoretic difference in meaning is not enough to refute this form of nominalism since "Propositions are theoretical entities, so what their identity conditions are is a theoretical issue" (152). Given this picture, the nominalism will be adequate only if the single proposition expressed by both sentences is suited to play all of the theoretical roles for which propositions are needed.

One theoretical role of propositions is as bearers of truth-values, and an account should be able to allow for the possibility that the proposition that o is maroon has a different truth-value from the proposition that o is hexagonal even if the all and only hexagons turn out to be maroon. Guigon attempts to accommodate this possibility by embracing a form of counterpart theory applied to propositions. A single proposition may be described as the proposition that o is maroon and as the proposition that o is hexagonal. These descriptions induce different counterpart relations. The single proposition may have a "maroon-counterpart" which is true in a world and a "hexagon-counterpart" which is false at that world. According to counterpart theory, this is exactly what is required to allow for the possibility that the proposition that o is maroon is true while the proposition that o is hexagonal is false even though these propositions are identical in the actual world.

Still, there are a number of other theoretical roles for propositions. They are, for instance, the objects of belief. From the point of view of psychology, it is important to allow for the possibility that one believes that o is maroon but fails to believe that o is hexagonal even if -- as a matter of fact -- all and only hexagons are maroon. It is unclear to me that Guigon's defense of the resemblance or natural class nominalist in terms of counterpart theory will also address this problem.

Faced with the co-extension problem, many nominalists have enriched their ontology to include tropes. On this view, each crimson hexagon possesses a particular shade of color and a particular shape. But according to the trope theorist, no two crimson hexagons possess identical colors or identical shapes. These colors and shapes are particularized properties, or tropes. The colors may exactly resemble each other, and the shapes may exactly resemble each other. An object is of a particular shade of crimson when it possesses one of the exactly resembling crimson tropes. The object is a hexagon when it possesses one of the exactly resembling hexagon tropes. Because the class of crimson tropes is distinct from the class of hexagon tropes, trope nominalism is often thought to be better posed with respect to coextension difficulties.

Ehring's paper addresses a renewed coextension problem for trope theory developed by David Manley (2002). The difficulty concerns determinates and their determinables. Crimson is a determinate of the determinable red. If the color of an object is crimson, then the color is also red. But consider a possible world in which the only red things are crimson. Then the class of color tropes that are crimson is identical to the class of color tropes that are red. This raises a coextension problem since it is at least possible for an object to be red without being crimson. Like Guigon, Ehring responds to this difficulty by embracing a counterpart theory on which the predicates 'crimson' and 'red' induce different counterpart relations.

Despite using similar resources to meet the difficulty, Ehring argues that trope nominalism is better positioned than simpler nominalisms that attempt to make do without tropes. In particular, the trope nominalist identifies seemingly distinct properties only in cases where a determinable is coextensive with one of its determinates. Ehring suggests that this is more acceptable because determinable colors "consist in" their determinate shades (128). I was unclear about the motivation for the move from this claim of constitution to a claim of identity.

I turn now to the papers addressing more methodological issues. Mantegani's paper challenges previous arguments from Rodriguez-Pereyra to the effect that universals are ad hoc ontology; they are "tailored to play a specific theoretical role" (Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002: 210-11). The thought is that by positing a universal to explain the commonality among maroon things, the realist is introducing an ad hoc posit that is not needed by the nominalist. Rodriguez-Pereyra contrasts the realist's posit with those of the resemblance nominalist who supposedly posits only concrete particulars which are pre-theoretically acceptable. But since resemblance nominalism posits entities of a distinctive kind (resembling particulars) in order to explain the fact that various objects are of the same type, Mantegani claims it has an ontology as tailor-made as the realist. In fact, Mantegani holds that the only view without ad hoc ontology in this sense is an austere nominalism offering no explanation of the resemblance holding among the various maroon cars beyond the fact that they are all maroon.

Melia's paper defends precisely this kind of austere nominalism against the charge of failing to offer an analysis of sameness of type, leaving too many primitives. When two particulars are both green, they are both of the same type. According to the challenge, the notion of sameness of type plays some role in our theories. For instance, duplicates must be of the same type in all respects. Since the austere nominalist does not offer an analysis of sameness of type, she must take it as primitive not only that two particulars are both, say, green, but also that they are of the same type (Lewis 1983; Dorr 2008). The objection is that this is an unacceptable proliferation of primitives.

Melia allows that claims about sameness of type introduce additional primitives into his theory. But he argues that this is not a cost because they add mere conceptual and not metaphysical primitives. They add conceptual primitives because the notion of being the same type is not analyzed. On the other hand, Melia suggests that one can "completely describe" (182) a world in which a and b are of the same type merely be claiming that a and b are both red. But, it is natural to wonder whether in reality a and b are the same color, and -- if so -- how reality can be completely described while failing to state this.

Melia offers a variety of considerations to suggest that one "does not have to add" (182) that they are of the same color in order to completely describe the world. He argues that the fact that a and b are both red "completely determines" that they are of the same color (183), which might suggest that the latter claim need not be added to make for a complete description.

It is unclear to me that whether this determination relation amounts to anything more than necessitation. But it should be highly contentious to claim that what is necessitated adds nothing to one's description of reality. No one would suggest that once I describe the world as containing a given human being I do not "have to add" that her parents exist. Yet, the existence of a human being, on many accounts, necessitates the existence of her material origins such as her parents. At other points, Melia suggests that "what it is" (183) for a and b to be of the same color is for them both to be blue, or for them both to be green, or . . . , or for them both to be red. But, it seems to me that the connection between whether one needs to add that a and b are of the same color to one's theory in order to completely describe the world and what it is for a and b to be the same color could be further developed.

The volume also includes interesting papers by Claude Panaccio on Ockham, by Jani Hakkarainen on Hume's theory of spatial properties, and by Markku Keinänen who attempts to develop a theory of natural kinds within trope theory.

These papers make important contributions to the historical understanding of the development of nominalism and to evaluating the prospects of nominalist theories of properties in contemporary debates. One point that should be flagged, however, is that all of the papers appear to be by men. Although it can be difficult to avoid this, it is one point on which the volume falls short.


Dorr, Cian (2008). There are no abstract objects. In Theodore Sider, John Hawthorne and Dean W. Zimmerman (eds.), Contemporary Debates in Metaphysics. Blackwell: Malden, MA.

David Lewis (1983). "New Work for a Theory of Universals". Australasian Journal of Philosophy 61 (December): 343-377.

Manley, David (2002). Properties and resemblance classes. Noûs 36 (1): 75 -- 96.

Rodriguez-Pereyra, Gonzalo (2002). Resemblance Nominalism. Oxford University Press.