Non-locality and Possible Worlds: A Counterfactual Perspective on Quantum Entanglement

Placeholder book cover

Tomasz F. Bigaj, Non-locality and Possible Worlds: A Counterfactual Perspective on Quantum Entanglement, Ontos, 2006, 294pp., $112.95 (hbk), ISBN 3938793295.

Reviewed by Michael Dickson, University of South Carolina


The intense philosophical discussion of Bell's Theorem, and more generally non-locality, that occurred amongst physicists and philosophers in the 1980s and 1990s produced a literature that is overflowing with distinctions, logical maneuvers, and insights into the nature, origins, and consequences of the entanglement of spatially distant systems in quantum theory.  It is understandable that the discussion took some two decades, for the issues are difficult and subtle.  And moving forward from where that discussion left off is no easy task.  At the very least, forward progress on these issues requires new philosophical insights and a high degree of mathematical and logical rigor.

One issue in particular was the source of a great deal of difficulty, and no doubt continues to cause misunderstanding.  It is the issue with which this book deals, in large part:  the role and proper application of counterfactual reasoning in proofs of Bell's Theorem and related theorems.

The problem is twofold, and arises from two distinct, though related, features of quantum theory, traditionally referred to as 'indeterminism' and  'complementarity'.  Let us consider each briefly.

First, it is not entirely clear how to handle counterfactual reasoning in an indeterministic context.  Suppose that while you are flipping a coin (which we will suppose to be a fundamentally indeterministic event for this discussion -- ex hypothesi, nothing in the actual world is causally sufficient to determine the result of the flip), I hum a bar of Ode to Joy.  My humming (again, ex hypothesi) has no causal influence on your coin-flipping.  You get heads.  If I had not been humming, would you still have gotten heads?

Logical intuitions seem to differ on this point.  Some argue that, because your flip was indifferent to my humming, you would still have gotten heads if I had not been humming.  My humming, or lack of it, could not have affected the outcome.  Others argue that we cannot affirm that the flip sans humming would have resulted in heads, because the result is in fact not determined by anything -- it was completely indeterministic.  The (imagined) trial flip sans humming must be considered to be another, independent flip of the coin, the result of which we cannot predict.  I'll call advocates of this view 'transworld-indeterminists'.  Yet another 'intuition' is that the counterfactual in question is itself indeterminate in truth-value.  (For the sake of full disclosure, the present reviewer takes this position.)

For our purposes, 'complementarity' refers to the apparent fact that certain pairs of measurements cannot, even in principle (i.e., while respecting the theory of quantum mechanics, but nothing else), be made simultaneously.  Bell's Theorem requires us to consider pairs of such measurements, and the prior Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen argument did as well.  We thus find ourselves speaking counterfactually:  "If, instead of measuring spin-z, we had measured spin-x …".

Consider, then, a typical run of an EPR-type experiment, where we measure, say, spin-z on each of two spin-1/2 particles that are entangled in the singlet state (perfectly anti-correlated in spin in every direction).  Suppose that you get 'up' (so I get 'down').  If I had measured spin-x instead of spin-z, would you have still gotten 'up' for your spin-z measurement?  Note, first, that complementarity compels one to speak about this situation counterfactually, and second, that the correct answer to this question is entirely unclear (or, perhaps, clearly indeterminate).

Bigaj's book is largely focused on the issue that I have just sketched.  In Chapter 1, Bigaj reviews the major points that emerged from the philosophical discussion of Bell's Theorem (and later generalized versions) in the 1980s and 1990s.  The material here is standard fare by now, and if one has not learned it elsewhere, one can learn it here, pursuing the adequate (though by no means exhaustive) references when necessary.  Chapter 2 similarly reviews various accounts of counterfactuals, notably Stalnaker's and Lewis'.  In the context of Lewis' analysis, the author here adopts the widely accepted view that, for the purposes of analyzing non-locality in quantum theory, it does not make much sense to allow for Lewisian 'minor miracles' (i.e., to allow that worlds in which 'minor' violations of natural law occur are nonetheless 'close' to the actual world).  Hence one is left with the notion that worlds are more similar the more that they match on matters of fact.

At this point in the discussion, little effort is made to connect the material of Chapter 1 with the material of Chapter 2, which is mildly (but only mildly) disappointing, because, as I noted above, they appear to be necessarily connected.  Indeed, the author sometimes portrays the use of counterfactuals in the discussion of non-locality as a means to strengthen Bell's Theorem, and indeed they have been used in that way, but it is worth keeping in mind that any discussion of EPR-type situations (such as that considered by Bell) is going to have to engage in counterfactual reasoning (even if secretly), for the reasons mentioned above.

Chapters 3 and 4 are at the heart of the author's concern.  Here he discusses at great length a series of arguments due to Henry Stapp dating from 1971.  These arguments change over the decades, but their aim is always, roughly, to show that Bell's Inequality (or a similar contradiction with experimental results) can be derived from a simple locality condition alone, one that is akin to what is now often called 'parameter independence', the notion that outcomes at one wing of an EPR-type experiment are independent of the (spacelike separated) choice of measurement at the other wing.  Stapp's arguments met with forceful resistance from various philosophers (in full disclosure, including from this reviewer), and the author's conclusion in chapters 3 and 4 is, in essence, that although some fine points in the debate might need cleaning up, Stapp's arguments do indeed fail.

In Chapter 5 we arrive at what has often been a point of contention between Stapp and others, namely, the choice of the correct similarity condition for the purposes of applying Lewisian truth-conditions for counterfactuals to the case of EPR-type experiments.  Recall that we have agreed to use matching of matters of fact as the criterion for similarly.  So consider a typical EPR-type experiment, with measurement-events P and Q occurring in spacelike separated regions.  One might wish to assert that locality demands that the occurrence of P be counterfactually invariant under changes in events spacelike separated from P, meaning, roughly (under a Lewisian approach to counterfactuals), that the nearest possible worlds in which Q fails to occur are still worlds in which P occurs.  Assume that both P and Q are random events, undetermined by their pasts (lest we get hung up on the delicate issues surrounding 'backtracking', the fact that denying P might necessitate changes in the past of P, which could influence whether Q occurs).

Bigaj (p. 187) proposes two ways to evaluate the relevant counterfactual.  According to the first (which Bigaj calls 'C1'), the counterfactual ØP []® Q ('if P hadn't occurred, Q still would have occurred') is evaluated by considering the worlds that match the actual world at all space-time points except those in the forward light cone of P.  In this case, those worlds are required to match in the region B, and thus Q must occur in those worlds (assuming that Q occurs in any non-P worlds that otherwise match the actual world, i.e., assuming that the non-occurrence of P does not causally or otherwise necessitate the non-occurrence of Q).  The second way to evaluate the counterfactual ('C2') involves considering worlds that match only on the backwards light cone (and its interior) of P.  In this case, there is no requirement that those worlds match the actual world on Q (which is not in the backwards light cone of P), and thus the relevant counterfactual will in general come out false.  Chapter 5 considers these two ways of evaluating counterfactuals in some detail, and announces the negative result that there do not appear to be any compelling reasons to adopt one or the other.

Let us pause here to consider the simple locality condition mentioned above in light of (C1) and (C2).  We suggested that locality requires that Q be counterfactually independent of changes in P:  (PQ) ⇒ (~P []→ Q), i.e., in worlds where P and Q actually occur, if P had not occurred, Q still would have.  Adopting (C1), a violation of this locality condition would in fact seem to indicate that some form of non-locality is at work, because in this case there must not be any worlds in which ~P and Q both hold; i.e., a change in P necessitates a change in Q.  But adopting (C2), a violation of this locality condition is ambiguous -- it could occur because of non-locality, but it could also occur merely because Q is random.  Moreover, the transworld-indeterminist will not accept that satisfying the condition evaluated according to (C1) amounts to locality.  According to the transworld-indeterminist, adopting (C1) guarantees that the locality condition holds even in cases where there is an indeterministic non-local influence of P on Q.  (Note, as well, that the issue of determinism looms large here.)

This discussion continues in Chapter 6, where the issue is put more explicitly in terms of the types of locality condition that are most appropriate to the two different ways of evaluating counterfactuals developed in Chapter 5.  The result is a pair of proposed locality conditions:

(L1) For all P, Q, if P and Q describe events mutually space-like separated, then Q ⇒ (P []→ Q).  (p. 226)

(L2) For all P, Q, if P describes a localized event … and Q is equivalent to a disjunction of statements, each of which described a single localized event … , spacelike-separated from P, then (~P ∧ ~Q) ⇒ ~(P []→ Q).  (p. 230)

(L1) is intended to be evaluated according to (C1), and in this case it is very similar to the locality condition discussed above.  (L2) is intended to be evaluated according to (C2).  Bigaj claims, without much direct argument, that "(L2) most likely represents the correct expression of the locality feature once the counterfactual connective is given the interpretation (C2)."

But notice that the transworld-indeterminist will likely not agree.  Indeed, according to the transworld-indeterminist, (L2) is trivially satisfied whenever Q is random (and not necessitated by P).  Suppose, for example, that the occurrence of P makes Q (non-locally!) very likely (whereas in the absence of P, Q is very unlikely).  Still, by the transworld-indeterminist's lights, (L2) is satisfied, because there are ('closest') worlds where P is true and Q is false.  (On the other hand, a failure of (L2) surely does indicate a failure of locality.)  Indeed, (L1) is also satisfied, because (C1) requires us to match on Q if possible, and doing so is possible, strongly suggesting that the transworld-indeterminst's position against (C1) makes a lot of sense, in this context.

A major result of Chapter 6 is the equivalence of (L1) and (L2) (interpreted extended versions of (C1) and (C2) respectively).  Bigaj argues for this equivalence by arguing that each is equivalent to 'semantic locality' (p. 231):

For all point-events P that are non-contradictory, there is a possible P-world w such that w is exactly the same as the actual world everywhere outside the future light cone of P.

This semantic-locality condition (SLOC), as Bigaj says, "claims to reflect some common intuitions regarding the non-existence of casual influences between space-like separated events when the acting event is indeterminsitic, i.e. not causally conditioned by its absolute past" (p. 271).  We should add, however, that the causal influences that are being ruled out here are necessary (deterministic) connections between spacelike-separated events.  SLOC is clearly consistent with merely indeterminstic influences.  (On the other hand, under certain assumptions, one can argue that in the context of quantum theory, deterministic and indeterministic theories are equivalent for some purposes, particularly the evaluation of locality.  This point could have been discussed profitably in this book.)

Bigaj uses SLOC to formulate a locality condition that expresses the (counterfactual) independence of the outcomes in one region from the measurement-choice ('parameter') in another, and shows that this condition is not sufficient to derive Bell's Inequality (nor other non-locality results, such as the GHZ Theorem, or Hardy's Theorem).  Hence Stapp's attempt to derive Bell's Inequality from parameter independence alone fails, even if we grant the controversial (C1).  I have already suggested that SLOC is not as uncontroversial as one might hope -- the transworld-indeterminist is unlikely to be coaxed into accepting SLOC by the equivalence of (L1) and (L2) -- but the conclusion is correct, and one that transworld-indeterminists will endorse.  As those back in the 1980s and 1990s argued, Stapp's attempts to show that parameter independence must be violated fail.

Recall that at the beginning of this review, I asserted that moving beyond the earlier discussion of non-locality requires new philosophical insights and a high degree of mathematical and logical rigor.  Although most of this book is a nice review of the earlier discussion, it does sometimes accomplish these more ambitious goals.  Whether the main line of argument of the book, sketched above, counts as a novel result is perhaps up for grabs, as I suggested.  But there are other points at which Bigaj makes some nice observations.

At other times, the book falls a bit short.  On the issue of rigor, we are sometimes presented with formal principles that are problematic, forcing one to fall back on intuition.  For example, a 'free-choice event' is defined as follows (p. 188):

E is a free-choice event iff there exists a possible E-world which agrees with the actual world everywhere outside the forwards light cone of E.

The definition appears to have the unfortunate consequence that every event in the actual world is a free-choice event.  The formal correction to the definition might be straightforward, but only because we can fall back on the intuition that a free-choice event is 'freely chosen, not caused by its antecedents'.

On the issue of insight, some questionable choices are made, for example, about similarity of worlds.  In general, Bigaj seems to have a strong preference for the notion that greater similarity is always had by matching on larger spatio-temporal regions, up to some stated maximum, given, for example, by (C1) or (C2).  Following Finkelstein, the author defines a 'primary point of departure', p, for a possible world, w, as a space-time point p at which w differs from the actual world, but no point in the backwards light cone (including its interior) of p in w differs from the corresponding point in the actual world.  Let Dn be the union of the forwards light cones (including their interiors) of all primary points of departure in possible world wn.  (I depart slightly from Bigaj's notation to keep things simple.)  Bigaj then suggests the following condition on similarity (p. 191):

World wj is at least as similar to the actual world as wk iff DjDk.

But consider two possible worlds, wj and wk.  In wk, there are two primary points of departure, each of which involves a miniscule change in the state of a non-chaotic system, and involves very little influence on the future states of the universe.  (Imagine, for example, a tiny thermal fluctuation within a system that is nearly in thermal equilibrium.)  In wj, there is a single primary point of departure, at the same spatio-temporal location as one of the points of primary departure for wk, but the event snowballs so that the future light-cone of this event is vastly different from the actual world.  Do we really want to say that wj is at least as similar to the actual world as wk?

Despite worries such as these, I enjoyed reading the book.  The author has an easy style, a good grasp of the material that is reviewed throughout the book, and helped me to think again about some of the issues surrounding non-locality.