Nonideal Social Ontology: The Power View

Nonideal Social Ontology

Åsa Burman, Nonideal Social Ontology: The Power View, Oxford University Press, 2023, 253pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197509579.

Reviewed by Amie L. Thomasson, Dartmouth College


Åsa Burman’s Nonideal Social Ontology is field-changing work that aims to both make visible and contribute to a paradigm shift from ‘ideal’ to ‘nonideal’ theorizing in social ontology.

Burman gives us a top-down view of the landscape that enables us to focus on the negative space, what is not said, and what shared presuppositions in the dominant prior discourse are false. She also shows why it matters, and how we should aim to change things. As she presents it, the landscape looks something like this: In its early days (as it was dominated by figures such as Margaret Gilbert, John Searle, and Raimo Tuomela), social ontology emerged with what Burman calls a ‘standard model of ideal social ontology’, with shared examples, assumptions, methods, and blind spots. For example, theorists tended to focus on small, cooperative social actions—such as taking a walk together, buying a beer in a café, or playing soccer together. They tended to abstract away from and be silent about complex historical factors such as injustice and oppression, and to focus on the benefits of social institutions (10). They took collective intentionality to be the ‘building block’ of the social world, and focused on ways we can performatively endow individuals with new deontic powers that are transparent—that is, known by the relevant people in the society (72–3).

Burman aims to help effect a change to what (following Charles Mills on ideal theory) she calls ‘nonideal’ social ontology (155). Such a shift, as she makes clear, has been happening already in work in social ontology by figures such as Sally Haslanger, Ásta, Katharine Jenkins, and Johan Brännmark. A key dividing line is oppression: ideal social ontology is mostly silent on oppression; nonideal social ontology is ‘vocal about it’ (155). Another important dividing line is whether we treat collective intentionality as a crucial building block for the existence of social institutions (174), and so whether we can adequately account for the idea that social facts may be ‘opaque’—hidden to many or all participants in the social world, and so open for discovery by the social sciences.[1]

Burman also calls for broadening work in social ontology to develop a richer picture of the social world that enables us to better explain the persistence of nonideal social phenomena such as inequality, oppression, and domination (227), and that brings into view long neglected but central social features such as economic class. She does so by developing what she calls “the power view” that puts the concept of power at the center of social ontology. Importantly, she notes that “there are types of social facts and forms of power that are opaque, or invisible, to all parties” (220). Calling attention to these enables us to notice the hidden forms of power that can affect the ways we live together and the life-chances of people in different groups and circumstances. In developing the power view, Burman broadens the view of powers at play in the social world, to include not only the deontic powers that have been the focus of attention in ideal views, but also what she calls ‘telic powers’, as well as forms of indirect social power, including what she calls ‘spillover powers’, and ‘structural powers’. The result is a far richer picture of the forms of power that play a role in the social world.

In my view Burman’s critique of past work on social ontology and her insistence on broadening it are important and right on target. I will suggest that we may need to broaden our view still further, if we want work on social ontology to provide “the foundation of the social sciences” (72).[2] We have reason to attend to work in the social sciences, even if our ultimate goal is eradicating oppression, for it is often the facts and trends uncovered by the social sciences that best enable us to identify hidden forms of injustice or oppression, which in turn enables us to intervene to help correct them. In broadening our work, we will have reason to rethink both Burman’s proposed way of understanding what ‘the social’ is, and her central focus on social power.

The Social

A central question in social ontology is: “Which are the social phenomena?” (36). In early (ideal) work on social ontology, Searle defined social facts as “any fact involving collective intentionality” (1995, 122). Burman, however, argues that we shouldn’t take collective intentionality as a fundamental notion in social ontology, as “both institutions and institutional facts can exist without collective intentionality” (84). Instead, Burman argues that institutions and institutional facts depend only on individual beliefs and common knowledge (90–92)—and can exist without irreducibly collective intentionality. Accordingly, she proposes dropping the reference to collective intentionality, and instead defining social facts as “any fact involving the intentionality of two or more agents” (205).

The proposed new definition, however, would imply, e.g., that the fact that I see snow and you (perhaps across the world) feel a pain in your big toe, is a social fact. But this doesn’t seem very social. It needn’t involve anything like interaction at all. Nor does it seem like the target of our inquiry in social ontology or social science.

More importantly, the proposed way of understanding social facts doesn’t seem to take into account the central concerns Burman raises about the ideal model of social ontology, including (1) focusing on cases of direct dependence on intentionality that leads social phenomena to be transparent (thus ignoring opaque social facts and forms of oppression) and (2) putting too much focus on the role of intentionality, which, as Haslanger puts it, has “the implication that much of social reality goes on in our heads, which lessens the importance of the material circumstances of social reality” (74–5). Both of these issues are orthogonal to the question of whether collective intentionality can be reductively understood in terms of individual intentionality plus common knowledge. As a result, the discussion in this part of the book this seems like a side-track from the important critique developed here.

So how should we define social phenomena? This is a question of conceptual engineering. One goal of defining ‘social phenomena’ is to identify what we are to study in social ontology. And a central (and admirable) goal of Burman’s way of redirecting social ontology is to develop a form of social ontology that can address the full range of phenomena studied in the social sciences, including both transparent and opaque facts, helpful and oppressive institutions, etc. If that is the goal, we might do better to drop the reference to ‘intentionality’ entirely and think of the ‘social’ as comprised of the facts, entities, and laws studied by the social sciences. The social sciences are often characterized as those disciplines that study societies or ways in which individuals live and interact together. So, one could instead consider the ‘social’ as including any phenomena that depend on our ways of living together (without assuming that that must be understood mentalistically or intentionalistically). Distributions of material goods will appear here, as will all the facts that emerge from the ways our lives together are structured (geographically, socially, legally, in terms of race or gender)—whether those facts are transparent or opaque.[3] In any case, if we want an account of ‘the social’ to serve us in a broader, less idealized, form of social ontology, we have reason to think again about how to understand ‘the social’.


Burman develops a social ontology centered on the notion of social powers: “The key idea is that social power is the central social concept and nearly all the social facts in which we are interested contain one form of social power or another” (200).[4] She distinguishes social power from ‘brute power’, in that “social power depends on the intentionality of agents, whereas brute power does not” (205); “there cannot be social power without the intentionality of agents” (205). Here again I wonder whether we have gotten far enough away from old intentionalist ways of thinking about the social world to fully effect the needed paradigm shift.

Burman distinguishes two genera of social power: direct/normative powers (which depend directly on the intentionality of agents) and indirect/non-normative powers (which depend indirectly on the intentionality of agents (203–204). Each of these genera is further divided into two categories: Direct social powers include deontic powers and telic powers; indirect social powers include spillover powers (which depend on the agent having a status function with certain deontic powers that affects their ability to achieve certain outcomes (216)) and structural powers (where an agent A has a structural power if and only if there exists a social structure and this affects agent A’s ability to effect certain outcomes (222)).[5] The last class, structural powers, are capable of being opaque, in the sense that these powers can exist without anyone being aware of them.

This broadened conception of social powers is clearly an improvement over prior accounts that focused solely on deontic powers. But the central focus on ‘power’ can mask an equivocation between two very different senses of the term. It can also leave out of view a variety of facts and questions at issue in the social sciences, namely those that aren’t centrally (or aren’t helpfully thought of as) facts about social powers.

Burman distinguishes between direct/normative and indirect/non-normative social powers. I think this distinction is even deeper than Burman’s classification of them as different ‘kinds of power’ might suggest. Linguists distinguish deontic modals (concerned with norms, rights, permissions, requirements: ‘You can get up from the table now’, ‘you must clean your room’) from ability modals (‘I can jump!’ ‘You can’t get there by car’). The first category (as Burman mentions) is basically normative—these powers are to do with what we are entitled, or obligated to do, or with how we ought to be, behave, or evaluate others. The ‘indirect social powers’, by contrast, are not ‘oughts’: they are expressed as ability modals that tell us about the abilities or dispositions of things in the world. There are, correspondingly, two senses of ‘power’ that I think ought to be kept distinct: ‘powers’ in the sense of deontic powers—rights, entitlements, permissions. And ‘powers’ in the sense of abilities or dispositions. Lumping them together as ‘forms of power’ might mask important differences.

Seen in this light, it is no accident that philosophers doing ‘ideal’ social ontology focused on the first (transparent, deontic) category, given the huge background of work on normative questions in philosophy. But the social sciences are concerned not so much with these normative questions, but rather with questions about how to predict and explain what goes on in the social world—which (among other things) concern ‘powers’ in the second sense.[6] And this may again lie in part behind the disconnect between work in ideal social ontology and work in the social sciences.[7]

The social sciences are centrally concerned with inferences, where at least one of the terms of the inference is to do with the social. (The other term might be physical, as we might worry about the effects of race on health outcomes in heart attack patients, or the effects of physical disability on economic status.) Some of these are inferences we can draw about individuals (who belong to a certain group) or a group of individuals—and so those can often be expressed in terms of talking about their social ‘powers’. For example, the ‘structural powers’ Burman identifies concern the inferences we can draw about an individual’s life chances (chances of getting a postdoctoral fellowship or catching Covid-19) given their membership in a collectivity (such as gender, race, or economic class).

But not all of the inferences at issue in the social sciences are best described in terms of the ‘powers’ of individuals or groups. The social sciences might also ask about:

The effects of remote schooling on learning outcomes

The effects of redistricting on election results

The effects of voting methods on voter participation

The effect of product placement on purchasing behavior

The effect of increased interest rates on economic growth and inflation

Answers to these questions might all involve inferences without people or groups of people in the antecedent—in that sense, they aren’t talking about ‘powers’ of individuals or collectives. Yet there are social facts to be discovered in these cases. Of course, one could try to rephrase the answers to these questions in terms that appeal to the effects of these changes on the powers of some groups or individuals, but it’s not clear that doing so would be helpful. If we are to achieve broad approach that can account for the full range of work in the social sciences, I suspect we may need to broaden our account again—beyond a focus just on the ‘powers’ of individuals or groups, to account for the role of the social sciences in uncovering (through observation and statistical analysis) what sorts of inferences we can and cannot make (and with what level of certainty) about all sorts of features of the social world.

There are at least three goals one might have in doing ‘social ontology’. One might (as with ideal social ontology) aim to understand collective action and the construction of explicitly bureaucratic and legal systems of (transparent) social institutions and the deontic powers they impose. Or one might aim to identify and fight hidden forms of oppression and injustice (the more recent forms of non-ideal social ontology that Burman identifies and fruitfully contributes to might be seen as largely having that aim). But as a third goal, one might aim to understand and categorize the full range of facts studied and discovered by the social sciences. What I have been suggesting is that, if we want to go that far, we may need to learn from Burman’s insightful critique and positive theorizing, and go on from there to broaden our view even further from where her work takes us. One might even consider dropping the terminology of ‘social ontology’ to speak more broadly of philosophy of the social sciences, or (more broadly still) of the philosophy of society—which might include not just the study of all kinds of social facts, but also of methodology in the social sciences, the functions of social language, etc.

In any case, Nonideal Social Ontology is an important achievement and will form a landmark in social ontology that articulates the shortcomings of the old approach, shows why a change is needed to meet other important goals, and shows how we can do it. It will be essential reading for anyone interested in understanding the history of recent work in social ontology, or in doing social ontology going forward.

[1] As Burman notes, I originally raised this criticism against Searle’s account of the social world: that it cannot account for the existence of types of social facts (such as recessions) that are opaque to participants in the society and require discovery by the social sciences (“Foundations for a Social Ontology”, Protosociology 18–19: 269–90, 2003).

[2] She also cites approvingly Francesco Guala’s call for an ‘empirical social ontology’ that “takes the results of social scientists into account to a much larger extent” (20).

[3] This also enables us to treat the communal lives of insects and other animals as involving ‘social facts’ without having to resolve questions about whether they have mental states or intentionality.

[4] Burman does acknowledge that there are social facts not about social powers (203), but she is most interested in re-centering social ontology on the notion of power.

[5] A social structure exists if and only if members of a collectivity, by virtue of that membership, systematically have their opportunities restricted or enhanced (221).

[6] Answers to these questions in the social sciences may of course enable us to better develop interventions, and better address normative goals we might have, such as identifying and reducing social injustice. Of course, work in the social sciences can also help us meet other goals, whether these are developing a more effective education system, reducing inflation, or selling more widgets.

[7] I think this also lies behind the distinction in economics between ideal and non-ideal theory: where the ideal is normative in that it is concerned with how one ought, rationally, to make decisions; and the non-ideal is descriptive in aiming to do empirical work enabling us to better predict how people will actually make decisions, act, etc.