Nonsense on Stilts: How to Tell Science from Bunk

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Massimo Pigliucci, Nonsense on Stilts: How to Tell Science from Bunk, U of Chicago Press, 2010, 332pp., $20.00 (pbk). ISBN 9780226667867.

Reviewed by Barry Barnes, Egenis, Exeter University



The title serves well as an indication of the genre to which this book belongs. Directed to the general reader, it is an attempt by a philosopher of science to assist her in dealing with the problem of demarcating science from non-science. For the author this is a moral problem and not simply a technical or aesthetic one: belief in science is conducive to our good, whereas belief in non-science or pseudoscience, of which instances are worryingly abundant, is conducive to harm and has to be opposed. Thus, we shall not go too far wrong if we identify Pigliucci as a science warrior and his book as a contribution to the literature of the science wars.

The content is certainly as this would lead us to expect. The usual suspects are attacked: postmodernists, humanist intellectuals, religious fundamentalists and the like. The usual examples appear: UFOs, paranormal phenomena, and of course criticisms of evolution. A potted history of science from Aristotle’s time is laid on (innocent Whiggism for the most part), and a flatpack philosophy of science (naturalist and verificationist). More idiosyncratic and slightly more interesting are discussions of science in the media (’it’s crazy out there’) and of think tanks (‘Caveat Emptor!’). And the author is a little less respectful than usual of heroic figures in science and philosophy, scorning to conceal the sheer viciousness of Isaac Newton, for example, and hinting that Plato/Socrates may well have been an overbearing old bore whose notion of dialogue bears scant resemblance to our own. None of this, however, alters the fact that for anyone who has encountered this sort of thing before little of philosophical interest is likely to be learned from the present example, unless it is through reflection on the function and design of such texts themselves.

As far as ‘the demarcation problem’ itself is concerned, the most salient chapter is the second, on ‘Almost Science’, wherein string theory and evolutionary psychology figure among exemplars inhabiting ‘a complex … intellectual landscape that occupies a transitional zone between science proper and activities that may not be entirely “scientific”’ (55). Just how one is supposed to evaluate ‘almost science’ isn’t made entirely clear. Whether out of tact or for some other reason the author pulls his punches somewhat in appraising it; perhaps some of his best friends are almost scientists. But the significance of the chapter here is that it acknowledges just how difficult it is (to say the least) to specify what is distinctive about science, and to identify precisely where the boundary allegedly encompassing it should be drawn, immediately prior to a series of chapters wherein a wide variety of beliefs and convictions credited by many millions of people are rapidly and confidently dismissed as bunk, ‘nonsense’ and ‘baloney’, and dispatched to the ‘wrong’ side of the boundary. No doubt, as the cover implies, books such as this need to be ‘entertaining’, and part of the fun for the reader is to savour the insults hurled at imagined opponents. But the price of adopting this all too familiar ‘wise-guy’ style only increases when it follows immediately on something so very different. If you find it so hard to tell just what should count as science, the question may come, who are you to tell us what counts as bunk?

Many writers are willing to pay a price here, in the not implausible belief that a confrontational ‘know-it all’ style is essential to attract their targeted readership, even though it is a complete turn-off to others and merely reinforces their negative stereotypes of science and scientists. As for Pigliucci, he lays on the appropriate rhetoric excessively even for a work in this genre, but there are signs that this may be because he is actually ill at ease with it and even a touch schizophrenic about it. In his chapter on ‘Science and Politics’ he criticises at length the ‘dramatically wrong’ (280) views on man-made global warming set out in Bjorn Lomborg’s Skeptical Environmentalist (2001), beginning in appropriately swashbuckling style with a sneer as a heading (137ff.), an ad hominem comment on Lomborg, and a call for his readers to switch on their ‘baloney detectors’. Soon a book with but a single chapter on the topic has become ‘a book on climate change that comes with a truly numbing 2,930 endnotes’ (140). But Pigliucci can’t keep it up. Outbreaks of sense and even a vestigial sense of fairness intrude into the text. We learn that Lomborg, like Pigliucci, actually accepts the reality of man-made climate change and is at fault only in suggesting that its extent and importance are being exaggerated. And the weapon used in attacking this suggestion isn’t the mace or the sword but the powder puff. Lomborg’s claims are ‘true but’; they attempt to ‘sow doubts … in the minds of his readers’; they are only ‘technically correct’, or ‘nitpicking’, or — we can imagine our author struggling unsuccessfully to recover his flagging nastiness here — ‘borderline dishonest’. In a nutshell, in what is the book’s most extended and detailed illustrative example, we find Pigliucci praising his enemy with faint condemnation. By failing to abandon human decency altogether, he nicely illustrates why it may be important to do so if your objective is to produce effective polemic. At least he can be commended for that.

Another chapter which raises intriguing issues is the final one: ’Who’s Your Expert?’ Here, moved perhaps by his readings of postmodern bunk, Pigliucci goes reflexive. He asks why readers should believe what he has written, given that they will ‘likely not have the time to fact-check every assertion’ (279). It’s a little late in the day perhaps, but after hundreds of pages pounding away about the importance of evidence he does at least eventually recognise that there is none in his book. The most that will be found there is testimony, and indeed the problem this poses merely recurs if one follows citations and has recourse to the literature of the sciences. (We should recognise as well that the problem is not so much that of ‘fact-checking’ every assertion as that of ‘fact-checking’ any assertion. For those with the time to wander down the lab to do a ‘fact-check’, I suggest they consult the work of Harry Collins (2004). Cited by Pigliucci as yet another postmodern critic of science, Collins has long had a well-earned reputation amongst sociologists like myself as at once a skilled investigator and a genuine admirer of what scientists actually do. There is no better general guide to where the facts being sought for are likely to have got to.)

The problem of expert credibility is of course the problem of how experts accumulate the trust and epistemic authority that make them what they are, something that Pigliucci comes close to recognising, even though he does not state it in so many words and persists in treating ‘authority’ as a no-no word. The methods he actually recommends to non-specialists for use in the evaluation of the empirical claims of a supposed expert are listed under the heading ‘Back to Reality’ (291). They include comparisons with the opinions of other experts; checks on expert qualifications and how far they are relevant to the domain involved; and searching for peer reviewed papers by the expert. God only knows what reality Pigliucci thinks he is coming back to. What he provides here is basically a template, not merely for argument from authority but for circular argument from authority: to evaluate expertise look to certain sorts of authority; do not worry if these sorts of authority are precisely those that reside in and constitute the expertise that is thereby justified. (As it happens, this isn’t necessarily bad advice, but it helps to know what you are doing if you follow it.)

Fortunately, one might think, ‘fact-checking’ is not the only general strategy Pigliucci recommends for evaluating expertise. He also proposes scrutiny of the arguments deployed by experts, to check for ‘logical fallacies and weak links’. Here he is recommending examination of something that, unlike ‘evidence’, is directly accessible in written sources. Pigliucci’s own text, for example, is replete with circular justifications of the kind I have just referred to, and some might wish to regard these as ‘weak links’ casting doubt on his credibility. For my own part I disagree, or at least I do not accept that purely formal criteria of good reasoning are in themselves helpful as indicators of credibility and trustworthiness. Most texts ever written, including most scientific and philosophical texts from Plato and Aristotle on, are replete with deviations from them, and in none are they absent. But the incidence of non-sequiturs and so forth in a text is no good guide to credibility.

It is not that good reasoning is unimportant. It does indeed merit critical scrutiny, but attention to context is crucial as this is carried out. In Pigliucci, for example, the explicit aim is to compare, discriminate and demarcate, and the aspects of good reasoning most worth attending to are those that make for reputable and trustworthy comparisons. Considered from this perspective, the circularities in his book are of marginal relevance. Indeed they might be regarded less as flaws than as helpful reminders of his commitments, of the passions to which his reason is enslaved, as it were. What is far more important is whether there is consistency in his treatment of the things he compares, both in the standards of comparison employed and in how the standards are interpreted and applied in practice. The reader should have little difficulty in confirming how comprehensively the text falls short in this crucial respect. Again and again its distinctions and demarcations are rationalised by appeal to standards rather than being products of their consistent application. Indeed the relevant demarcations can seem so intuitively obvious to Pigliucci that he forgets even to make them. His very first paragraph, for example, having asserted that to distinguish sense from nonsense is a moral duty, ends, by way of illustration, with the remark that ‘pseudoscience can literally kill people’. He would have done well to have paused at that point; and taken thought.

I suspect that there is no way of presenting the knowledge and methods of the sciences to general readers that does not fail in some important respect. And the comparison of these with alternatives, whether those that engage in competition with the sciences, or those that pretend to be sciences themselves, or those that rub along with them, peacefully co-existing at other locations in our elaborate division of technical and intellectual labour, is inordinately difficult, as Pigliucci is obviously well aware. But he does not even try to meet the challenge this implies, choosing instead for the most part a facile approach that covers its limitations with the truculent style and affectation of contempt for one’s fellow human beings increasingly encountered in the literature of the science wars. The sciences deserve better than this.


Collins, H. (2004) Gravity’s Shadow: The Search for Gravitational Waves. Chicago University Press.

Lomborg, B. (2001) The Skeptical Environmentalist. Cambridge University Press.