Normal Rationality: Decisions and Social Order

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Edna Ullmann-Margalit, Normal Rationality: Decisions and Social Order, Cass R. Sunstein and Avishai Margalit (eds.), Oxford University Press, 2017, 291 pp., $65.00, ISBN 9780198802433.

Reviewed by Richard Pettigrew, University of Bristol


One of the great pleasures of reading a volume of collected essays that span a writer's working life is that you begin to see how the author's mind works. Nowhere is this more true than when the writer so clearly invites the reader into her mind through her style of writing. Edna Ullmann-Margalit was such a writer. She was also an extraordinarily insightful and original philosopher who left us a brilliant and provocative body of work. This is a collection of that work assembled by her sometime co-authors Avishai Margalit and Cass Sunstein.

While the book is separated into two parts -- 'Decisions' and 'Social Order' -- this structure in fact undersells the unity of the papers presented. In nearly all of the works reprinted here, Ullmann-Margalit is concerned with the gap between our formal, orthodox theory of rational action -- as formulated in classical decision theory and classical game theory -- and the ways we should in fact make decisions, either on our own as individuals or collectively as a society, and how we might justify proceeding in the ways we do.

The first part, 'Decisions', collects her work on how we should make these decisions as individuals; the second part, 'Social Order', brings together the essays that address our collective decisions. In both cases, Ullmann-Margalit holds that there are many decisions we face for which orthodox decision theory or game theory is inadequate in one of two ways: either (a) it falls silent, giving no guidance; or (b) it demands more of us than we are able to give. As Ullmann-Margalit explains at one point, the orthodoxy is akin to Newtonian mechanics, which works well for medium-sized objects travelling at modest velocities, but fails for the very large or the very small or the very fast. In both sorts of case -- both (a) and (b) -- we need strategies that lie beyond the orthodoxy to deal with this inadequacy. Ullmann-Margalit not only identifies the inadequacy; she also identifies rational solutions. The book is thus well named: at all points, it concerns how we should make decisions in real and familiar, but certainly not always quotidian, concrete cases -- when we face a choice between different but indistinguishable boxes of cereals in the supermarket; or the choice whether or not become a parent; or the decision whether the defendant in a trial is guilty or not.

The volume begins, after an insightful overview of the papers by the editors, with 'Picking and Choosing', Ullmann-Margalit's influential paper with Sidney Morgenbesser. How should you choose between two options when there is no reason that tells in favour of one over the other? The canonical examples are, of course, Al-Ghazali's hungry man who must choose between two identical dates and Jean Buridan's hungry ass faced with two equally nourishing piles of hay. Three insights from this paper stand out: two are thrown in as asides, while the other introduces the thought that will animate Ullmann-Margalit's writing throughout the rest of the volume. First, they note that such decisions are more common than we might expect. This is not because, contra Leibniz, the world is filled with qualitatively identical dates or bundles of hay or other sorts of commodity; rather, it is because, when picking between two or more commodities, their known differences are irrelevant to their value or their differences are simply not known, and so our subjective reasons for choosing between them are symmetric. The second insight, which sets the stage for the much of the rest of the book, is that, faced with such choices, people make second-order decisions -- decisions about how to make such decisions. They might decide, for instance, always to choose the left-hand can of soup from the supermarket shelf when faced with the serried rows of near-identical cans. The final insight, thrown in as a footnote, is that the rationality and ubiquity of these second-order decisions refutes the so-called theory of revealed preference. After all, they show that, very often, we should not infer from the observation that I always pick the left-hand soup can over the alternatives that I prefer the former to the latter. Rather, I am indifferent between that soup can and the others on offer. And, indeed, it is that indifference that has led me to make this second-order decision and adopt my bias for the left-hand can in the first place.

Such second-order decisions -- decisions concerning how we will break the symmetry when our reasons for choosing are in equipoise, or when decision theory demands too much of our limited cognitive powers -- provide the underlying theme for the remainder of the book. In 'On Presumption', Ullmann-Margalit draws upon the idea to analyse the legal notion of presumption. The most famous instance of this phenomenon is, of course, the presumption of innocence in criminal trials. We decide, as a society, that when evidence or lack of evidence is balanced equally for and against a defendant's guilt, we will choose to declare them innocent and acquit. Here, of course, we need the second-order decision not only to break the symmetry but also to ensure that individual judges or juries do not break it in a haphazard and potentially discriminatory way. When we make the second-order decision to favour the left-hand item when faced with a collection of identical commodities, our reason for making such a decision is to avoid the paralysis of first-order indecision; and we choose a particular bias rather than randomising, since the latter takes more effort, perhaps. In the legal case, we again make the second-order decision in order to ensure that we make a first-order decision; but we choose the particular bias we do for more substantive reasons -- allowing judges to randomise or to pick based on an irrelevant tie-breaking factor will have unjust consequences; and we prefer the bias in favour of innocence to the alternative bias in favour of guilt because we prefer to be wrong in one way (false negatives) than in the other (false positives), at least in the legal setting.

In 'Second-Order Decisions', Ullmann-Margalit teams up with Cass Sunstein to survey other sorts of second-order decisions and to categorise them: we might use protocols of varying strengths, from rules to presumptions to standards; we might break the choice into smaller choices; we might delegate the choice to someone else. And they consider the different ways in which we might justify using one or other of these.

In 'Big Decisions' -- for me, the highlight of the book and one of the recent high points in the literature on rational choice -- Ullmann-Margalit gives one of the most insightful early treatments of a sort of decision that has recently received much attention due to L. A. Paul's influential book, Transformative Experience (2014). Ullmann-Margalit calls these "big decisions": decisions in which at least one of the possible outcomes of at least one of actions available to you will change something core about who you are, and in particular will change some of your most deeply held values. As Paul has also emphasised, this poses a problem for orthodox decision theory: if your values will be different after the decision is made, to which values should you appeal when you make the decision? Your current values or your later ones? Ullmann-Margalit provides some potential solutions.

The remaining two chapters in the first part are closer to epistemology than rational choice theory. The first, 'On Not Wanting to Know', concerns when it might be rational to want not to know something. The other, 'Holding True and Holding as True', discusses the difference between believing a proposition and believing that a sentence that expresses that proposition is true. The former is interesting, though it omits a discussion of the Ramsey-Good theorem on the value of knowledge, which would have been an illuminating framework in which to place Ullmann-Margalit's insights.

Just as much of the first half is concerned with the second-order decisions we make as individuals to circumvent some of the difficulties of first-order individual decision-making, so the second half is concerned with the second-order decisions we make as a society to avoid the problems that face first-order group decision-making. These second-order group decisions are what we call norms. So the norm of driving on the left-side of the road in the UK is analogous to my bias in favour of the left-hand can of soup. And the norm of using the organs of the deceased for transplantation unless the family objects is analogous to the norm of acquitting a defendant unless the evidence tells positively against them. In 'Revision of Norms', Ullmann-Margalit discusses how norms conceived in this way change. And in 'Solidarity in Consumption' and 'Trust, Distrust, and in Between', she applies her account of norms to certain peculiarities of market behaviour and the question of when it is rational to trust or distrust someone.

Of course, in the case of second-order group decisions, there is a sense in which the group does not always consciously or intentionally make the decision in question. Rather, the norm often emerges from the aggregate effect of individual behaviour that is not directed at producing the norm. This leads Ullmann-Margalit, in 'Invisible-Hand Explanations' and 'The Invisible Hand and the Cunning of Reason', to consider so-called invisible hand explanations. This leads her to draw an important distinction between two different sorts of such explanations: invisible hand explanations of the origin or emergence of a norm, and invisible hand explanations of its persistence. And this in turn leads her to an important insight about the way such explanations can be used to justify the norms in question: explanations of the origins of a norm have the potential to justify it; explanations of its persistence do not. And yet economists and political theorists often attempt to justify a norm by citing an invisible hand explanation of its persistence -- Ullmann-Margalit gives the example of Friedrich Hayek, in particular.

The book finishes with an epilogue, 'Final Ends and Meaningful Lives', in which Ullmann-Margalit turns to the question of when a life is meaningful. As Jenann Ismael (2006) argues in her own reflections on this question, Ullmann-Margalit contends that, just as the value or meaningfulness of a novel will not be calculated by taking the value or meaningfulness of each sentence or each chapter individually and summing up the results, so the value or meaningfulness of a life must also be a holistic function that takes into account not only the aggregate total of meaningful moments, but also the shape of the life that contains them and the narrative it forms. One worry about such an account is that it holds up clean, traditional narrative arcs, ordered lives that form planned unities from youth to death, as a sort of ideal -- approximating them accrues to the individual value or meaningfulness. But, as Margaret Urban Walker has argued, it is a culturally specific practice to hold up the 'career self' as an ideal, and it ignores other ways of living a meaningful life (2008).

Throughout the book, Ullmann-Margalit provides rich and varied, but life-like and plausible examples. These motivate her brilliant, wide-ranging insights and support her arguments; but they are also strewn throughout the texts as interesting asides. The reader is thus left with the impression of someone who saw the philosophical significance of much of everyday life, as well as the importance of reflecting philosophically on our lives if we wish to live them well and rationally. Inadvertently, then, the reader is left with a vision of how to live a philosophical life -- a fitting tribute to a philosopher who was deeply engaged in humanitarian and social justice causes throughout her own life.


Jenann Ismael (2006) 'Death', in Death And Anti-Death, Volume 4: Twenty Years After De Beauvoir, Thirty Years After Heidegger, ed. Charles Tandy (Ria University Press) pp. 181-198.

L. A. Paul (2014) Transformative Experience (Oxford University Press).

Margaret Urban Walker (2008) Moral Understandings: A Feminist Study in Ethics (Oxford University Press).