Normative Bedrock: Response-Dependence, Rationality, and Reasons

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Joshua Gert, Normative Bedrock: Response-Dependence, Rationality, and Reasons, Oxford University Press, 2012, 228pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199657544.

Reviewed by G. F. Schueler, University of Delaware


The stated aim of this book is "to demystify the normative." (p. 1) To this end Joshua Gert provides what he calls a "response-dependent" account of two "basic normative concepts", that is, "ones that are not defined in terms of other concepts". (p. 1) The somewhat surprising concepts selected as basic are 'irrationality' and 'harm'. Though these are not moral concepts, Gert argues they can be used to build an account of moral concepts that are not themselves response-dependent. (p. 104)

The idea is that these two concepts can be understood on the model of other response-dependent concepts such as 'green', though unlike color concepts, which are learned by ostension through contact with instances, these two basic normative concepts are learned through contact with what are represented as instances. (p. 172) But all response-dependent concepts depend for their consistent use on contingent facts about human responses. It is a feature of this book that the author is quite self-conscious about the kind of argument he uses, which he refers to as "linguistic naturalism", more or less in the spirit of the later Wittgenstein. So the account offered is not intended to be an analysis of these concepts but a description of their use and of how they are learned, based on contingent but very general facts about the humans who use them. An important background assumption of this method is that there is no prospect that concepts found indispensible over a long period of time are "useless" (p. 8).

The idea that basic normative concepts are response-dependent is aimed at side-stepping the problems encountered by, on the one side, flatly realist accounts of such concepts and, on the other side, expressivist accounts. These problems are familiar from efforts to explain moral concepts. Realist accounts of moral concepts, though they can make sense of the idea that moral claims are straightforwardly true or false, face the difficulty that the properties to which they apparently refer are not detectable in nature and in any case such accounts leave unexplained why we should be interested in these properties. Expressivist accounts seem to make it problematic whether moral claims are true or false. Response-dependent concepts, according to Gert, when they involve a high level of agreement among users in the way color concepts do, don't have these problems. (pp. 39-48)

So a good amount of space in this book is given to explaining the response-dependence of color concepts. According to Gert, color concepts are learned by ostensive definition (as in 'This lemon is yellow') and are usable in the way they are because the human visual apparatus, and so the human visual response to colored objects, is quite uniform across different people and different observational conditions. That uniformity, and the fact that it is a feature of a single sense modality, is what makes these concepts 'response-dependent' and is why we understand color terms as referring to objective properties of the objects to which we apply them, rather than to our own inner states. Outlier cases are taken to indicate defects in vision (colorblindness) or oddities in viewing conditions (a yellow lemon might be said to 'look orange' in a certain light). This contrasts with pain, where the responses are varied enough that we take pains as inner states, not features of the things that cause the pain.

Gert argues that the two basic normative concepts he considers are response-dependent in the same sense and for much the same reasons color concepts are. His central chapters give distinct arguments for the response-dependence of each of these two concepts, which are claimed to constitute "normative bedrock" in the sense that because they are not analyzable, no philosophical justification for their use is necessary or possible. On Gert's view it is "necessary and a priori knowable that it is irrational to fail to be averse to harms." (p. 188) This is not because this sentence is analytic but because the extensions of these two ostensively learned concepts overlap, in something like the way 'morning star' and 'evening star' do, while the objects to which each concept applies are knowable a priori from the responses provoked. (p. 191)

Though Gert has a lot of interesting things to say about why 'harm' is a response-dependent concept, and how exactly that works, I will focus on his discussion of 'irrationality', because this seems the more surprising concept to treat as response-dependent. According to Gert we understand the actions of others through a sort of in-built "mindreading" mechanism (p. 111) that allows us to interpret actions by what Daniel Dennett has labeled "the intentional stance." (p. 126) Even if there is no "independent module, analogous to the visual system", we still "automatically, quickly, and largely unconsciously . . . interpret the behavior of others" (p. 126) by assigning goals to the agent we are interpreting in such a way as to make sense of her action. Occasionally though an action "fails to make sense because no goals can be identified that could justify the cost involved in performing the action." (p. 112) It is not just that the mechanism makes a mistake in assigning goals but that because of "implicit assumptions" of the system, there is an "explicit refusal to give any interpretive result". (p. 163) When that happens the action being interpreted is said to be "irrational". (p. 110) "The response that . . . underlies our notion of objective irrationality is one that is generated by the failure of an automatic interpretative mechanism." (p. 171) This is a weak notion of irrationality, which contrasts with 'makes sense', and allows numerous incompatible actions to count as not irrational (p. 109). But the important point is that this concept of irrationality is taught through "ostensive teaching" in a way analogous to a color term such as 'green' (p. 109). Gert argues that this way of understanding the concept of irrationality gives a solution to the 'wrong kind of reason' puzzle. (p. 92) And he holds that it allows a plausible account of incommensurability. (p. 127) At the same time though, this is the heart of his argument that the concept of 'irrationality' constitutes normative bedrock. According to Gert this concept is learned ostensively, like a color term, and is therefore response-dependent and unanalyzable. So no further or deeper argument is possible to justify or explain its use in human life.

Is it plausible that 'irrational' is response-dependent in the way Gert argues that color concepts are? We can distinguish two questions here: 1) Whether our goal-assigning mechanism can generate response-dependent concepts and, 2) Whether judgments that an action is irrational flow from failures of this mechanism in the way Gert says they do.

It is hard to see, I think, how it could be that our interpretative, goal-assigning mechanism (or whatever it is) itself, when used successfully, produces response-dependent concepts, in the way Gert holds that our visual system does, since it is hard to see that the success (truth) of my thought that you have some goal in performing an action depends on anything in me. Whether or not you have some goal in performing an action is up to you, not someone interpreting your action. This is not a point with which Gert need disagree since his claim is that when my goal-assigning mechanism fails, that is, doesn't find a plausible goal for the action being considered, the thought it produces in that case is response-dependent. And perhaps that could be true even if this mechanism doesn't produce response-dependent judgments when it works successfully. The thought that an act is irrational, according to Gert, arises from and depends on this failure of interpretation by my 'mindreading' mechanism. And it is due to the fact that all humans have such a mechanism, which fails when it does, that the concept of irrationality is response-dependent.

But this seems problematic too. On the usual view, an agent's goals are there when she acts whether or not anyone else thinks they are. When I attribute goals to someone whose action I observe, my success in that attribution, if it comes, will depend on what goals that person really does have, not on anything in me. But then my failure in interpreting her action, if I do fail, will also depend on the person's actual goals. So it is hard to see on this view how the judgment generated by this failure would be response-dependent. Of course we should distinguish not finding any goal at all for some action from attributing to the agent a goal she doesn't actually have or not attributing one she does have. On the usual view those would seem to be the ways my 'mindreading' mechanism might fail. (And if I can find no goal at all then, arguably, the event I am interpreting won't seem to me to be an action.)

As I understand him, Gert is not claiming that failures of these sorts lead the interpreter to think the agent irrational. Nor however is he thinking of the kind of case where the judgment of irrationality is based on the goal attributed being not such as to justify the cost to the agent. On the usual view this would not be a result of the failure of my goal-attributing mechanism. If I attribute some irrational goal to an agent then the success or failure of my attribution depends on whether she actually has that goal. If she does, and so is irrational, that would be success for my mindreading mechanism, not failure. Such a view of irrationality would imply an analysis of 'irrational' (perhaps that the goal or act fails to meet some standard) that made it non-basic and made attributions of irrationality dependent on prior judgments of the agent's goals. Gert's view is different. He wants to say that interpreters note some actions as actions, and tag them as 'irrational', independently of any goal assignment. (p. 163) The interpretative mechanism doesn't merely assign goals. It also sometimes balks, signaling the act 'irrational', in circumstances where no plausible goals are in the offing, though no actual goal assignment has been made. (p. 163)

It is not in dispute that acting in pursuit of a goal that, e.g., results in more harm than benefit, is irrational. The question is whether an interpreter's judgment that such an action is irrational is made on the basis of a previously assigned goal that is judged to fail to meet some standard or is, as Gert would have it, normative bedrock, 'response-dependent' and unanalyzable. Gert's argument for this idea depends on saying that this judgment is a result of a specific sort of failure of our mindreading mechanism, a failure that all humans will experience in the same sorts of cases, but one that comes from a feature of this mechanism that is different from mere goal assignment. On the usual account, success or failure of ascriptions of goals to agents depends only on whether those agents do in fact have those goals, a fact completely independent of whether they are interpreted as irrational. As such neither goal ascriptions nor judgments about the irrationality of those goals would seem to be response-dependent. Ascriptions of irrationality to actions being interpreted would be further, distinct judgments at least partly about the goals of those actions. In this case a judgment of irrationality would be analyzable and so not a 'bedrock', unanyzable response generated by the failure of the goal assigning mechanism. So the argument of Gert's book turns on whether he can establish his 'response-dependent' view of the concept of irrationality.

Though I have raised some questions about one of Gert's central arguments, none of these questions detract from the fact that this is a very serious, clearly written, densely argued book, which expounds a suggestive and original account of normativity. It deserves, and will repay, the attention of anyone interested in the deep issue it addresses.[1]

[1] Thanks are due to Joshua Gert for helpful discussion of the contents of this review.