Normative Externalism

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Brian Weatherson, Normative Externalism, Oxford University Press, 2019, 245pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199696536.

Reviewed by Bruce Russell, Wayne State University


In this book, Brian Weatherson defends a view about what is important when it comes to evaluating actions and beliefs (and also agents and advice). He writes:

I'm going to defend a fairly simple, and fairly extreme, position. It isn't a bad-making feature, in any way, of a belief that the believer thinks it is irrational, nor is it a bad-making feature of believers that they have beliefs that they think are irrational . . . The general principle throughout is to motivate and defend a picture where what matters is conformity to the actual rules -- be they rules of action or rules of belief -- rather than conformity to what one takes (or even rationally takes) the rules to be. (4; my italics)

And he explains:

Normative externalism is the view that the most important standards for evaluating actions, mental states [like belief], and agents are typically external to the actor, believer, or agent being evaluated. It can be appropriate to hold someone to a moral, or epistemic, standard that they do not endorse, or even that they could not be reasonably expected to endorse. If one has bad standards, there need be nothing wrong in violating them, and there is nothing good about upholding them. (1; see also, 8; my italics)

I italicized words in these quotes that bring out how extreme Weatherson's view is. We might grant that being guided by moral or epistemic standards you happen to accept is not in any way a good-making feature in itself (cf., 7), but it is harder to believe that being guided by such standards that it is rational for you to accept is not in any way a good-making feature in itself.

For Weatherson, rational belief is belief that is responsive to the evidence, and normative externalism is compatible with evidence being restricted to certain mental states (e.g., beliefs, seemings, sensations, intuitions) (3). So it is compatible with what is often called internalism in epistemology. Ultimately, Weatherson does not think evidence is internal in this sense, but that is a substantive thesis not entailed by normative externalism itself (see, 21).

Ethics in the extreme

Weatherson's defense of his view has three parts: (1) He argues via counterexample against radical subjectivism, which is a form of internalism that says that what is most important is following your principles whatever they may be. (2) He argues via a dilemma against rational internalism that says what is most important is following standards it is rational to accept. His argument is that rational internalism is either driven to radical subjectivism to answer objections it raises against externalism (e.g., that it offers no guidance when it merely tells us to do the right thing!) or it becomes a form of externalism if it tells us to accept the principles that the evidence supports (not what a person thinks it supports). (3) He criticizes what he takes to be the best argument for internalism, which he calls the symmetry argument (72). This argument says that moral uncertainty can be founded either on factual uncertainty or uncertainty about what the correct moral principles are, and these two different bases for moral uncertainty should be treated in the same way. Weatherson grants that normative externalism treats them differently but argues that this is not a problem.

(1) The extreme form of internalism is a type of radical subjectivism which says, contra externalism, that what "is (most) important [is] that people follow their own principles," (7), the moral principles they sincerely believe to be correct. Weatherson offers several counterexamples to radical subjectivism, some actual, some hypothetical. Robespierre, the architect of the French Revolution's Reign of Terror where "heads rolled like cabbages," is his central example of an actual case of someone who followed his principles (6-7, 10, 13). In Quentin Tarantino's film Pulp Fiction, Vincent Vega (John Travolta) thinks a person who keys another person's car should be killed. Weatherson's hypothetical Antoine thinks that a prankster should be killed who threatens to prank 101 people if he doesn't prank a particular person among those 101 (76-77). He calls Antoine a villain (77) and Robespierre a moral fanatic and monster (6-7). It seems obvious that what is most important is not following your principles whatever they may be. It is more important that Robespierre and Antoine do the right thing.

(2) Perhaps what is most important "is that people follow the principles they have rational reason to accept," (7) not merely principles they in fact accept. But Weatherson thinks that on an internalist's interpretation of "rational reason to accept" it is not important that people do what they have rational reason to accept. He argues that Antoine believes that his evidence supports his conclusion that the pranksters should be killed (77). Assume that this belief coheres with Antoine's other beliefs and intuitions so that on an internalist conception of rational belief, it is rational for Antoine to believe that the pranksters should be killed. Weatherson thinks that what it is rational to believe, in this internalist sense of rationality, about what you should do is not important. It can lead to moral fanaticism just like radical subjectivism. What is important is what the evidence actually supports regarding which principles to follow, not what a person thinks it supports (77). A normative externalist can accept the view that what is most important is to follow principles they have "rational reason to accept" given an externalist interpretation of that phrase. But that represents no concession to internalism. This is the dilemma mentioned above that Weatherson uses against rational internalism: either the same objections apply to it as apply to radical subjectivism or, to avoid them, it must be understood as a form of epistemic normative externalism.

(3) Weatherson criticizes what he calls the symmetry argument against externalism and for internalism that says "moral uncertainty and factual uncertainty should get very similar theoretical treatments and the externalist offers very different theoretical treatments of them" (39). He denies that moral uncertainty and factual uncertainty should receive very similar theoretical treatments. In a case of what Weatherson calls factual uncertainty, if it is certain that one of actions A or B is the morally best action to perform and the other is a moral catastrophe, but it is uncertain which is which, then if there is a third option, C, which is not a catastrophe, but also not as good as the morally best action, you should do C. You should play it safe. An example of what Weatherson calls moral uncertainty is a case where it is uncertain whether mid- to late-term abortions are morally similar to killing a three-year-old child and so whether such abortions are a moral catastrophe, equivalent to murder. Suppose a woman can either help her friend obtain an abortion, not help her and turn her in to the authorities, or do nothing. Helping her friend risks the moral catastrophe of being an accomplice to murder; turning her friend in risks being disrespectful of her friend's autonomy and a gross violation of their friendship. Doing nothing avoids those catastrophes and so is a way to play it safe. But Weatherson thinks that is not what the friend should do. What she should do is help her friend get an abortion or turn her in, depending on which is really the right thing to do (see 43-44 for this case). If abortion is like murder, she is an accomplice to murder if she helps her friend get an abortion, and so she does wrong if she helps her. If it is not like murder, the right thing to do is to help her friend get an abortion. That's all the externalist can say: she should do the right thing, whatever that is (cf., 75-78 where Weatherson says something similar about pranking someone to save 100 others from being pranked). But according to Weatherson the friend should not do what I am calling "playing it safe" and do nothing, neither help her friend nor turn her in. So Weatherson concludes that, in the moral realm, there is not a symmetry between factual and moral uncertainty and the fact that externalism is committed to denying this symmetry is no objection to it.

One might object to Weatherson's criticism of rational internalism on the grounds that he offers a false dichotomy. The options are not between following principles the person merely thinks the evidence supports (or even those that his coherent system of beliefs and intuitions support), and principles that the real evidence supports. (Perhaps the place where Weatherson comes closest to explicitly offering this dichotomy is at: 81-82.) Early in the book he discusses Descartes' correspondence with Princess Elizabeth, and writes, "The good person, according to the view Descartes puts forward in the correspondence, is one who makes a good faith effort to do the best they can. Someone who does this, and who is not irresolute, has no cause to regret their actions" (18) [Descartes says "repent," not "regret," which is importantly different: I may have no reason to repent for what I have blamelessly done but rationally regret doing it because of its unforeseeable very bad consequences.] Did Antoine make a good faith effort to do the best he could before judging that the pranksters should be killed? It's not clear that he did. Weatherson writes that, "Robespierre had ample reason to believe that he ended up on the wrong track" (7) and that he executed people "on incredibly flimsy pretexts" (6). And he says that the "appalling cruelty" slave owners inflicted on their slaves was right before their eyes (97). Weatherson says that Robespierre violated the rule, "Follow the principles it is rational to accept" (7; his italics), presumably because he (like the slave owners) overlooked what was morally obvious. Perhaps Antoine, Robespierre, and the ancient slave owners were all morally negligent. Antoine did not give the issue enough thought; Robespierre and the slave owners ignored what was "right in front of them" (7, 97). None of them was doing the best they could even if all of them thought the evidence supported their moral views and actions.

This notion of "doing the best you can" can also be used in constructing a sufficient condition for blamelessness. It seems plausible to hold that a person is morally blameless in doing something if he has a legitimate excuse (broadly construed to include exemptions), and he has a legitimate excuse if he does the best he can when considering the evidence he has, and should have, before reaching a conclusion about what he should do. While this principle won't excuse Antoine, Robespierre, or the ancient slave owners, it does imply that before, say, the mid-twentieth century men were blameless in using the demeaning term "girls" to apply to women (100) or in complimenting them on their looks, and that not too many years ago people were blameless in eating meat (even if Weatherson's Guy, the regular American meat-eater, is not: 104). It also implies that if Huck Finn does the best he can in weighing the testimony of his "parents, friends, and teachers" against what he has learned through his relationship with Jim, and concludes that he should turn Jim (a runaway slave) in to the authorities, he would be blameless in doing that even though it is in fact the wrong thing to do (at 72-73 Weatherson discusses the Huck Finn case). The idea of doing the best you can is not one that he considers, but it is a middle ground between the notions of doing what you merely think the evidence supports and doing what the evidence in fact supports.

Weatherson discusses blame and the relation of moral ignorance to blamelessness in Chapter 5. It is a long, complicated discussion in which he considers arguments and cases that might be thought to favor internalsim but, in the end, argues they do not. He considers Gideon Rosen's example of Bonnie who has contracted a virus that causes her to fail to see that "considerations involving others give her reasons for action" (86). Weatherson seems to think Bonnie is not blameless, but imagine that because of the virus she sees ignoring the interests of others like most of us see etiquette's prohibition against eating peas with a spoon. Contra Weatherson, that seems enough to render her blameless when she steals a cab from a family who has been waiting a long time in the rain for one.

In Chapter 6, the last on ethics, Weatherson argues that what he calls hypocrisy is not a vice; we wish that really bad people like Robespierre were more hypocritical and failed to live up to their principles! But perhaps hypocrisy is a vice only when people do not live up to their good principles. Promises do not always found even prima facie duties (say, when they are a promise to do something horrendous), but sometimes they do. Morally significant properties or categories need not be significant in every context.

In Chapter 6, Weatherson also writes about what is central and what peripheral to normative externalism. He says, "The core idea is that moral norms are independent of both what one thinks the moral norms are, and what one should think the moral norms are" (115; my italics). That is different from how normative externalism was initially characterized in terms of what is most important, namely, conformity to the actual rules of morality and epistemology. And if norms of blamelessness are moral norms that make essential reference to whether an agent has good reason to think that some principle of action is correct, then some moral norms will themselves make reference to what one should think about other moral norms, e.g., norms of right action. Still, these norms of blamelessness could be independent of both what anyone thinks, or should think, about them, and so according to the core idea, would be externalist norms.

Epistemology in the extreme

In the first half of the book, Weatherson defends his view as it applies to ethics; in the second half, as it applies to epistemology. There he defends what he calls Change Evidentialism, which is the view that:

only new evidence that bears on p can compel a rational agent to change their credences in p. (23)


A person with a rational attitude toward p is under no rational obligation to change that attitude unless their evidence for or against p changes. (120)

Weatherson prefers to talk about beliefs being rational rather than justified (124), and he says that "a belief is rational just in case it is responsive to the evidence in this way [that is, responsive in the way the correct rules for weighing evidence require or permit]" (3). He seems to allow that defeaters of which a person is aware can count as rebutting or undercutting defeaters of that person's belief that p by either being evidence for not-p or evidence that undercuts the reason-giving force of the evidence for p, respectively. If someone I have good reason to trust testifies that the Detroit Tigers won their baseball game last night that testimonial evidence can be overridden if I read in the Detroit Free Press that they lost. And it can be undercut if I learn that the person who testified was lying to me for some reason. Weatherson seems to think that the rationality of my credences is not affected by my possessing higher-order evidence that my processing of the evidence I have is unreliable or unreasonable (193). Change Evidentialism is incompatible with counting this sort of higher-order evidence as relevant to the rationality of my beliefs or credences because, for Weatherson, it is not evidence that bears on p.

There seem to be clear counterexamples to Change Evidentialism involving this sort of higher-order evidence, and Weatherson grants that, "All it takes to refute Change Evidentialism is one case" (132). Weatherson gives a case that seems to show that learning of higher-level evidence can make it reasonable to lower your confidence in what you have believed. It involves testimony. Milica has known Danail for a long time and has plenty of reason to believe that he is a reliable testifier. Suppose Danail tells Milica that he saw a common friend at the mall earlier in the day. Milica has no reason to doubt that this is true. Normally under these conditions Milica should be very confident that Danail did see the common friend at the mall. However, "Milica learns that she has taken a drug that makes most people very unreliable when it comes to processing evidence by testimony" (193). Perhaps people who take this drug frequently believe not-p when someone testifies that p or in that situation are prone to affirm the consequent when p is the consequent of some conditional. Intuitively, on learning this about the drug she has taken, Milica should reduce her confidence in what she believed on the basis of Danail's testimony.

But Weatherson argues that Milica should not reduce her confidence. His argument is that the effects of the drug are not a rebutting defeater to Milica's belief that Danail met a common friend at the mall because those effects are not evidence that he did not meet such a friend. He also says: "nor is it the most natural kind of undercutting defeater. It provides no reason to think that Danail is an unreliable testifier" (p. 193). Weatherson argues that Milica has a perfectly sound reason to believe what Danail told her, namely, his testimony. "And that reason isn't defeated by the drug" (193).

Speaking literally, what Milica learns about the drug is neither a rebutting nor an undercutting defeater of what she believes on the basis of Danail's testimony. But its effects are like the effects of learning that Danail's testimony is unreliable; it acts like an undercutting defeater. If Milica learned of some undercutting defeater (say, that Danail was lying), she should not trust that what he told her is true. But the same thing results if she learns that her processing of good evidence is unreliable. Even though the input is good, she cannot trust the output, namely, her beliefs, because she knows that her processing of the input is unreliable.

Weatherson thinks that internalists have to accept what he calls a Judgment Screens Evidence (JSE) principle. According to this principle, once a person like Milica forms a judgment that p she must then ignore the evidence she had for believing p. If she then learns that she has arrived at p by an unreliable process, she should stop believing p, suspend judgment, or at least reduce her confidence in p. Weatherson goes on to argue that JSE is false: if someone accepts it, they have no way to block certain higher-order evidence that leads to an infinite regress, or at least to an absurd conclusion such as that a team will win more games than it plays in a season! (See, 193-94).

Even if true of some higher-order considerations when coupled with JSE, this would not show that all appeals to higher-order evidence have this bad result. Maybe there is a way to restrict the range of application of JSE. More importantly, it's not true that internalists must accept JSE. They can just hold that some higher-order evidence acts just like first-level undercutting defeaters. Some sorts of higher-order evidence are grounds for believing the output of some cognitive process is unreliable even if the input is not. Undercutting defeaters also result in unreliable output, but they do it by rendering the input unreliable. In either case, the subject has reason to distrust the output of his cognitive process. It is not that the higher-order undercutter "screens off" the first-order evidence. We might call such higher-order undercutters dePeaters to indicate that they are grounds for thinking that the cognitive Process is unreliable.

In Chapter 10 Weatherson argues that there is nothing wrong with being akratic. He begins with another example of a testimonial skeptic. Aki believes that no one should believe anything on the basis of testimony, even though that's false. Despite this, Aki believes her friend's testimony that the Detroit Tigers won their game the night before. Absent her friend's testimony, Aki should believe that the Tigers lost given her evidence that they were playing a stronger team. Weatherson calls Aki "a paragon of rationality" for believing in accord with what really is evidence (her friend's testimony) and ignoring the misleading evidence based on what she thinks are sound arguments for skepticism about testimony. He says that she is "inadvertently virtuous" like Huck Finn: she does the right thing while thinking it's the wrong thing. He says that she should believe: "the Tigers won last night and it is irrational for me to believe this." This is an example of what Weatherson means by having an "akratic attitude." (See, 170-71 for this entire paragraph)

Following his standard methodology, Weatherson considers, and then criticizes, arguments to show that there is something wrong in a stance like Aki's. The arguments are not that complicated but the criticisms are. It's hard to decide whether what Weatherson calls epistemic akrasia, namely, believing that p while at the same time believing it is irrational to believe that p, is problematic in itself. If, in the case of Milica, the higher-order evidence about her unreliable processing of testimonial evidence from Danail is grounds for her reducing her confidence in what she believes as a result of his testimony, then it shows that Change Evidentialism is false. It does not matter whether it's a bad thing that Change Evidentialism implies that akratic attitudes are rational, when in fact they are irrational. Weatherson acknowledges that the relevance of higher-order evidence to rational belief is "the most pressing challenge to Change Evidentialism" (122) and that all it takes to refute Change Evidentialism is just one case (132).

The last big topic that Weatherson addresses in the epistemology part of the book concerns disagreement between what appear to be epistemic peers. Here I basically agree with Weatherson's position that whether it is rational for someone to reduce her credence in some proposition, p, on learning that the person she had heretofore considered to be her epistemic peer disagrees, depends on what is the most plausible explanation of why the other person disagrees: "In all cases, the guiding principle is that each party should be asking themselves, and each other, why does the other party have the views they have?" (204). (See, also, 204 and 223 where Weatherson writes of what is the "most plausible" account of the basis of the disagreement, and 220 where he writes about what it is "reasonable for [someone] to infer given just the facts about their conflicting credences"). Is it because super detective Ankita has reason to believe that she has more relevant information that p than super detective Bojan, or vice versa (213; 215-16), or [rarely, says Weatherson, 204] that the two disagreeing parties know they have the same evidence? According to Weatherson, it's not true that epistemic peers who disagree should never be conciliatory, nor that they always should be. For each party in any circumstance, it depends on what is the best explanation of their disagreement given that party's total evidence.


Zania is trying to figure out what to do in a case where pranksters have threatened to prank 100 people in addition to Vicky if she does not prank Vicky herself (74-75). The best consequences will result if Zania pranks Vicky, but isn't that using Vicky as a mere means? What should she do? What will provide guidance? Weatherson writes:

The normative externalist has an easy thing to say about Zania's case. If consequentialism is the true moral theory, then she should perform the prank . . . If the deontological theory is true, then she should not perform the prank . . . And that's all there is to say about this case. (75)

This, of course, offers Zania no guidance at all. In Spike Lee's Do The Right Thing, a respected elderly gentleman in the community that they call "da'Mayor" tells Mookie (Spike Lee), in a most serious and sincere way, that he should, above all else, always do the right thing! That advice does not serve Mookie well when he must decide whether to direct a mob's anger towards Sal's pizzeria and away from Sal and his son, or let them take their anger out on them. He ends up throwing a trash can through a window of the pizzeria which leads them to trash Sal's property and leave Sal and his son unharmed. That seems like the right thing to do, but da'Mayor's advice offered no guidance.

Mookie did the best he could in deciding what to do and so I think he was blameless in getting the mob to turn on Sal's pizzeria rather than on Sal and his son. Is the fundamental guidance norm: do the best you can do in the situation you find yourself in? If so, doesn't it also fail to offer guidance? And why are we justified in thinking it is true? Well, one answer is: we are justified in believing it's true if we did the best we could do in searching for a fundamental guidance norm. Of course, it might seem that we could have done better and come up with a more substantive principle, one of which in epistemology might be a substantive, pluralistic principle of inference to the best explanation or, in morality, a pluralistic theory of right (which Weatherson says he holds himself). Still, it seems to me that moral and epistemic norms should provide some guidance. However, normative externalism offers no guidance. Weatherson denies this (37) despite saying that in the abortion and prankster cases all that normative externalism says is that if doing A, is right, then do A, and if doing B is right, then do B (46-47; 75).


At the back of his book (226-30), Weatherson lists ninety-one cases that he has discussed, accompanied by a summary description of each case. In his index, he gives the page(s) in the text on which each particular example can be found. These two guides are enormously helpful.

Most of the examples are meant to evoke intuitions, but he says that he is not resting the argument for his view on the intuitiveness of the view: partly because he has doubts about the usefulness of intuitions but also because he grants that his own view is unintuitive. There do seem to be examples that evoke intuitions that show that normative externalism is false. In the case of Danail and Milica, it seems more likely that Weatherson's attempt to debunk the intuition fails than that the intuition is mistaken. Something similar is true of the intuition that Bonnie (in Rosen's example) is blameless in stealing the cab from a family who has been waiting a long time in the rain for one. And there are versions of the Huck Finn case where "the testimony of his parents, friends, and teachers" renders Huck blameless if he turns Jim in. Not so many years ago many people were blameless in eating meat. All these examples show that "wrong" does not imply "to some extent blameworthy," contra what Weatherson holds (108). That leaves open the possibility that normative externalism is true of "wrong," at least in some objective sense of "wrong," but not of "blameworthy," which seems to be a more agent-relative concept (though not a subjective one).

Often Weatherson tries to defeat intuitions that seem to count against normative externalism by offering and then criticizing his own and others' arguments for those intuitions. But the intuitions seem to stand on their own (or would if the cases were slightly altered); the failure of the arguments he offers on behalf of those intuitions does not undermine their intuitive force.

Weatherson says that internalism is counterintuitive in certain respects, too. He also says, "There is no version of normative internalism in ethics that is both motivated and plausible" (69). Even if all that were true, it would not be a defense of normative externalism. Weatherson contends that not much has been done to motivate internalism by appeal to cases (70), but it seems that there are enough cases to defeat normative externalism and to begin to form the bases for a defense of internalism.

Weatherson's book is complex and ambitious, chock-full of examples and arguments. It is challenging, but much can be learned from it. It warrants careful study whether you are a normative externalist or not.


Thanks to Matthias Steup and Anastasia Friel Gutting for comments and suggestions that improved this review.