Normative Reasons: Between Reasoning and Explanation

Logins Normative Reasons

Artūrs Logins, Normative reasons: between reasoning and explanation, Cambridge University Press, 2022, 241pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781316513774.

Reviewed by Daniel Drucker, University of Texas at Austin


Once you believe in normative facts, facts about what we ought to do, what’s fitting to believe, and all the rest, there’s still a question of how agents can translate their assumed grasp of some of these facts into some correspondingly motivated behavior. (I use ‘behavior’ to cover both normal acts and things like forming an attitude on some basis.) Normative reasons are an important part of one conceptual framework for understanding how this can happen. A normative reason is a consideration for or against some bit of behavior that can, at least most of the time, in paradigmatic cases, motivate behavior through being believed or otherwise appreciated in the right way, at which point they are also motivating reasons. In this framework, reasons are a bridge, and so we would expect them to have a specifically dual character. This makes them different from oughts or norms, which in themselves lie entirely on the normative side; it’s not very tempting to say that true ought facts must somehow be usable by the agent in deciding what to do, but of course people have been tempted to say that of normative reasons.[1] And it makes normative reasons different (so it seems to me, at least) from desires, which lie on the personal side, in that unlike desires, normative reasons are considerations for or against something and thus aren’t mental even though they can be grounded in mental things.

So, I’ll just say, I’m more or less convinced about the basic elements of Artūrs Logins’s account of normative reasons in this book, which strikes me as natural. On his view, a reason answers a question expressed by sentences of the form ‘why F?’ where someone’s F-ing, were they to F, would be some of their behavior. He thinks that, because there are two ‘readings’ of questions with that form, we get two kinds of reason, relating to explanation and argument/reasoning. (Logins, rightly to my mind, views reasoning and argument as very tightly connected.) This way he’s able essentially to subsume two of the main non-primitivist rivals to his own account, those who (roughly) see normative reasons as the things that explain why one ought to do something, etc., and those who (roughly) see normative reasons as the contents of fittingly-held premise-attitudes in a sound argument for the content of a thereby fittingly-held conclusion-attitude. This has a number of advantages, and Logins does a good job of cataloging them. I am completely convinced that he has the best view on the market right now. That said, there are some aspects of the view and of the project that I find interesting, which I’ll lay out here. In doing so, I don’t mean to suggest that the negative parts of Logins’s book, which occupies most of the book’s pages, aren’t worth your time: they are really good! He lays out a number of important problems for existing accounts that double as plausible constraints on a successful account. That said, I’ll focus on his positive proposal.

Before I do, here’s an overview of what’s in the book. In Chapter 1, Logins gives an introduction, including a very helpful overview of the twentieth-century dialectic about reasons and a useful objection to the reasons-first program pursued recently by, e.g., Schroeder (2021). (I, personally, would’ve been interested in hearing about reasons pre-Wittgenstein, but you can’t include everything.) In Chapter 2, Logins characterizes the reasoning view due to, among others, McHugh and Way (2016), and presents some challenging objections to it. In Chapter 3, Logins focuses on the explanation view of reasons due to, e.g., Broome (2013), Finlay (2006), and Maguire (2016), presenting important problems for these views as well. In Chapter 4, Logins discusses the evidence view of reasons—reasons as evidence for what we ought to do— due to Kearns and Star (2008). In Chapter 5, Logins presents his own proposal, on which I will say more shortly. And in Chapter 6, Logins applies his view to attempt to dissolve the debate between those who think there are pragmatic reasons for believing a given proposition and those who don’t. (Logins thinks one kind of reason for belief can be pragmatic, the explanatory kind, but not another, the reasoning kind.)

Here is Logins’s proposal:

The Erotetic View of Reasoning. For that p to be a reason to F for S is for S to be (a part of) the content of an appropriate answer to a (S directed) question ‘why F?,’ i.e., to be either (a) (a part of[2]) the content of an appropriate explanation providing (pattern of an) answer to a (S directed) question ‘why F?’/‘why ought S to F?’ in its explanation requiring reading; or (b) the content of an appropriate premise in a good argument/reasoning providing (pattern of an) answer to a (S directed) question ‘why F?’/‘why ought S to F?’ in its argument/reasoning requiring reading. (170)

As I think of it anyway, the idea is that reasons are either good arguments—arguments that could be well-deployed in good reasoning—in the context or good explanations in the context, ‘context’ understood broadly. Again, Logins assumes ‘why F?’ has two ‘readings’. On the first, the speaker’s request for information is satisfied if given an explanation of F’s truth. (For example, “why ought I to help the starving child?” might elicit “because we are called to help those in special need whatever their distance from us”.) On the second, an answer might be “because the Pope said that it is our duty in these kinds of cases”, which doesn’t typically explain why it’s the person’s duty but might well form the basis of good reasoning of theirs toward their helping the poor. What is the nature of these readings? Surprisingly, Logins doesn’t say very much about it. He provides references, especially to the work of Richard Whately, with which I genuinely wish I were more acquainted. He also lists Prior and Prior (1955),[3] but unfortunately I didn’t find much of a discussion of the distinction the author needs.[4]

I’ll offer Logins an account of the distinction that seems to fit with some of the things he says, which posits a kind of speech act ambiguity, in that one kind of asking ‘why F?’ involves challenging but not requesting an explanation, and vice versa for the other. Then I’ll argue that if this is really where the two readings are coming from, we should expect there to be a better explanation of those readings than Logins provides. Still, it’s yet a further question whether that would change the shape of his overall account. Suppose I say, “Matt Gaetz will be Speaker someday”. (Apologies to non-Americans, including, I believe, Logins.) You, shocked, say, “why will Matt Gaetz (of all people) be Speaker?” A proper response might be “I have it on good authority from a guru who’s never falsely predicted something like that”, something that may be convincing even if in no way explanatory. But if I say, “why will it happen? That’s so interesting!” Then the answer might be about the social dynamics of the House Republican caucus; for example, I might predict they’ll have many Speakers across different ideological tendencies. Exchanging these answers feels inappropriate. To this extent I agree with Logins that there’s something real here.

But at least part of the explanation of this is also clear to me. In the one case, the speaker clearly doesn’t take it for granted that Gaetz will be Speaker, even post-assertion; thus for the conversation to proceed normally, they have to be convinced. Mere explanations that aren’t dialectically helpful won’t be appropriate answers. So, we need an argument that really might be convincing, even if only based on trusted testimony. In the other case, the person suggests they’re already convinced, so it can be taken for granted that Gaetz will be Speaker someday. Then it’s clear that an argument isn’t called for; the hearer is already convinced! Hence, an argument that doesn’t add anything else is inappropriate.

That leaves something unanswered: why does using ‘why’ call for either an argument or an explanation? One possibility is that arguments and explanations are just two different sorts of things, and coincidentally using ‘why’ calls for one or the other of these things. I don’t think that’s very plausible. Clearly these things have something in common. That is, a satisfying explanation would be: there’s this determinable, X, and arguments and explanations are both determinates of X. But what is the determinable? I’m drawn to thinking that explanations really are arguments, with the logical positivists. In a discussion of a kind of contextualism about normative reasons put forward by Finlay (2006), Logins himself, following Salmon (1971), takes issue with this account of explanation. One problem, Logins says, is that adding irrelevant true premises can maintain an argument’s soundness: “adding some (law-like) necessary truths to a valid argument will not undermine the validity of the argument. But, of course, adding some random necessary truth to an explanation would typically undermine the goodness of the explanation” (113). I don’t think this is a very good argument against thinking of explanations as arguments. Determinates of the same determinable can have different standards. Poker and gin rummy are both determinates of the determinable ‘card game’, but a good or even a legal hand is very different in the two games. So, what it takes to be good as an explanation might be very different from what it takes to be a good other kind of argument. I’m not a philosopher of science, and it’s not important to what I’m saying that the argument theory of explanation ultimately be as viable as I suspect it is. I think we should expect there to be a determinable here. It would be strange if ‘why’ questions, which simply do not feel ambiguous, ask for just these different sorts of thing. I think identifying exactly what this determinable is is a pressing project for someone who wants to defend Logins’s view, which I suspect many will.

All this raises a more basic question. Why do we group together just these uses of ‘why F?’ to elicit some kind of answer? All sorts of conversational goals are frequently taken for granted. In a group of committed Christians discussing the problem of evil, an explanation of why God would allow such-and-such kind of suffering had better maintain core features of their shared view of God. Does this mean that we should think that there are these two kinds of reason, the kind that would be part of a good explanation of a phenomenon by a Christian’s lights vs. the kind that wouldn’t be? I doubt that. If that’s how we carve things up, we haven’t really gotten to the nature of what a reason is; the account would feel arbitrary. But as I argued earlier, it feels like a good explanation of the phenomenon Logins appeals to is that the speakers can clearly be in different states where one or another determinate or a determinable would be useless and the other wouldn’t be. But we can partition possible answers to uses of ‘why F?’ in many ways, and nearly all of them will not be illuminating as an account of the nature of normative reasons, or indeed, as correct. So one thing I’d like to know is why it really matters to an account of normative reasons that we can make this distinction between kinds of acceptable or appropriate responses to ‘why F?’ questions and the other sorts of distinctions we could make.

To be clear, I don’t think this necessarily undermines Logins’s account. I’m not at all saying an account could not be given here. This is offered, it is hoped, as a productive challenge. One way to answer would be to find something that specifically connects the nature of reasons to Logins’s particular distinction, as opposed to any other distinction we might draw. I myself am not sure how the story goes from here. I’d love to hear Logins tell it, though: his erotetic account does seem to do a good job in respecting our intuitions, and it seems to do an admirable job in the debate about whether there are ‘pragmatic’ reasons for belief or not.

So, let me say, the rest of Normative Reasons is great, philosophy done with a clear respect of the craft. Logins presents views in very clear and explicit terms, he surveys the literature judiciously and also has good judgment in his evaluation of problems for different views as serious or not. Proponents of preexisting views may not be moved to accept Logins’s preferred account, but I suspect they’ll find his challenges worth answering and frequently difficult to answer. (The discussion of Moore-paradoxical reasons is particularly good.) I wish I had the space to discuss more of the book here, but if you’re interested in normative matters—even if not in reasons, specifically—you can read this book with profit. It’s good, thoughtful philosophy, and I think it moves the discussion of reasons forward significantly.


Thanks to Robbie Kubala for very helpful comments on a draft of this review.


Broome, John. 2013. Rationality Through Reasoning. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell.

Finlay, Stephen. 2006. “The Reasons that Matter.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 84:1–20.
Kearns, Stephen and Star, Daniel. 2008. “Reasons: Explanations or Evidence?” Ethics 119:31–56.

Maguire, Barry. 2016. “The Value-Based Theory of Reasons.” Ergo 3:233–262.

McHugh, Conor and Way, Jonathan. 2016. “Fittingness First.” Ethics 126:575–606.

Prior, Mary and Prior, Arthur. 1955. “Erotetic Logic.” Philosophical Review 64:43– 59.

Salmon, Wesley. 1971. “Statistical Explanation.” In Wesley Salmon (ed.), Statistical Explanation and Statistical Relevance, 29–87. Pittsburg, PA: Pittsburgh.

Schroeder, Mark. 2021. Reasons First. Oxford, UK: Oxford.

Williams, Bernard. 1981. “Internal and External Reasons.” In Moral Luck, 101–113. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge.


[1] See, of course, Williams (1981) for the locus classicus.

[2] It would have been helpful for Logins to say more what he means by a content-part. The notion isn’t obvious or uncontroversial.

[3] I loved this paper and now think it anticipated a lot of important developments in the semantics and pragmatics of questions. Thanks to      the author for the pointer to this very under-cited work.

[4] There are two candidates I saw. On page 44 and following, the Priors distinguish between questions that put an answer forward for consideration and request ‘yes’ or ‘no’ on the one hand and questions that require the hearer to come up with their own answers. But that’s not Logins’s distinction between requests for explanation vs. argument. The other candidate: on page 49, the Priors interestingly equate ‘why’ and ‘for what reason’. But that’s also obviously not the author’s distinction.