Normative Subjects: Self and Collectivity in Morality and Law

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Meir Dan-Cohen, Normative Subjects: Self and Collectivity in Morality and Law, Oxford University Press, 2016, 258pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199985203.

Reviewed by Benjamin C. Zipursky, Fordham University


It is probably no accident that Bernard Williams and Jeremy Waldron figure prominently in Meir Dan-Cohen's excellent new book. All three were colleagues in the 1980s and early 1990s at Berkeley. Dan-Cohen's philosophical style resembles his former colleagues' in its historical erudition, its moral insight, and its capacity to use philosophers' tools to illuminate pressing issues in moral and political life. Like Williams, he melds questions of personal identity with ethics and morality in a distinctively twentieth-century, almost existentialist manner. Like Waldron, he traverses moral, legal, and political philosophy to explore issues of sovereignty, free speech, and human rights. And like both, he takes pride in finessing many conventional debates between consequentialists and deontologists, while helping himself to the insights of each. It is fair to say, however, that Dan-Cohen has brought himself to a firmly Kantian moral framework by the end of the book.

The book's title, "Normative Subjects," contains a nice ambiguity. As Dan-Cohen indicates, it focuses on normative subjects in two respects: one reflexive and the other jurisdictional. Part of the book is about the construction of self that is undertaken by a person or a group or another kind of agent. It is about subjects in the sense that it is about reflexive subjectivity: How do I conceive of myself or how do I present myself or how do we, the members of this group, understand ourselves as group-members? What I call "jurisdictional" is a quite different sense of "normative subject." If one supposes that a "norm" is a rule or principle enjoining a domain of actors to act in certain ways, then a rather natural question arises: to which entities does the norm apply? If part of the answer is persons, then that merely opens up the question of who or what counts as a "person." Is it coherent to suppose that corporations, countries, social groups, families, or nonhuman animals are the sorts of things that can lie in the domain of subjects to which a norm or norms apply?

Dan-Cohen candidly admits that his volume "is something of a hybrid between a collection of essays and a 'real book,'" (p. ix) and the book's organization into three parts reflects this compromise. Part I -- "Construction and Revision" -- addresses a range of interlocutors and problems, displaying a third connotation of the "Normative Subjects" title -- namely, the essay-collection idea. Part II -- "Value and Humanity" -- for the most part, does not expressly build on what has come before but in fact develops major framework themes. Those themes -- setting forth the relationship between prudence, morality, and law (Chapter 5) and identifying in "dignity" a core value of morality (Chapter 6) -- sustain the remainder of the book and have a distinctly foundational, programmatic feel. Part III -- "Collective Subjects" -- appears to change topics once again, but can also be viewed as an application of Part II to non-biological persons. In the end, I will embrace the essay-collection conception of the book, but I will primarily approach it from the one-book point of view.

Two of the assertions central to Part I (Chapters 1-3) might be called "social-dependency claims." In Chapter 2's critique of Harry Frankfurt,[1] Dan-Cohen advances the thesis that the identity of individuals turns in part on which social norms are shared by substantial groups or subgroups within their community. And in Chapter 3's analysis of forgiveness and repentance, he asserts that the identity of the persons who have committed certain acts turns in part on whether certain social practices (like a practice of repentance and forgiveness) have been employed to classify or reclassify the connection between acts and agents. Obviously, each claim is striking for its embrace of a reflexive conception of identity that puts self-creation first, and its simultaneous endorsement of anti-individualistic, social-practice based conception of the possible ingredients of individual identity. The anti-individualism of Chapters 2 and 3 stand in striking contrast to Dan-Cohen's highly individualistic essay, in Chapter 4, on Williams' famous discussion of Paul Gauguin and moral luck.[2]

Part II's most ambitious claim, defended in Chapter 5, is that personal identity operates in three concentric circles: in the inner circle, one has oneself qua unique individual; in the middle circle, one has oneself qua citizen of a political community; in the outer circle, one has oneself qua human being. The outer circle provides reasons to a person as a human being; the middle circle provides reasons to a person as a citizen; the inner circle provides reasons to a person as one's self with one's own individual projects, goals, and affiliations. Morality is the domain of the outer circle. Law is the domain of middle circle. Prudence is the domain of personal decisions for one's own projects and more generally one's own interests and affiliations.

Chapter 6 articulates a Kantian conception of dignity as a sort of badge of identity for all natural persons as persons. Dan-Cohen builds into his account what he regards as a sort of virtuous circularity. Instead of relying upon a Kantian conception of persons as noumenal selves or on Waldron's "equal rank" conception of dignity,[3] Dan-Cohen regards our being valuers as a ground for our being bearers of dignity. To act in accordance with the belief that I, as a human being, am a locus of intrinsic value is to treat other human beings as loci of intrinsic value ("ends in themselves") because they are human beings. The imaginatively analytic quality of this basic Kantian topic, combined with its putative metaphysical modesty, are reminiscent of Stephen Darwall's work. While Darwall aims to capture a distinctive Neo-Kantian position by moving from a first person to a second person framework,[4] Dan-Cohen's framework challenges us to moves from the first person singular ("I") to the first-person plural ("we").

The dignitarian conception of persons in Chapter 6 yields a rather surprising defense of retributivism in criminal punishment in Chapter 7. For deterrence reasons, we punish perpetrators of violent crimes in order to diminish the likelihood that such crimes will be performed in the future. We protect potential victims by doing so, and by announcing credibly that we will do so. Yet, according to Dan-Cohen, the justification for the administration of punishment to the individual perpetrator of a violent crime resides in its being a way of vindicating the dignity of the victim. Even as it justifies punishment, retributivism also sets a principled limit on it. The same dignitarian concerns that justify the retributive side of our punishment practices also limit our punitive practices, now in conformity with the recognition that the criminal defendant is entitled to be protected against the mistreatment that defines some punishments, even if such mistreatment has beneficial social consequences.

The "Collective Subjects" chapters will strike many as more novel and (even) more rewarding than those in Parts I and II, for it is here that Dan-Cohen's erudition in a broad range of normative subjects (so to speak) comes to the fore. Chapter 8 (on collective persons) reaches the unsurprising conclusion that business corporations have practical personhood but lack moral personhood and cannot be ascribed dignity. It then suggests, however, that the collectivities of persons (like the group "Jews" or "blacks"), while not persons themselves (either practical persons or moral persons) might nonetheless be properly ascribed dignity. "Put more generally, we can sensibly ascribe dignity to a collectivity when affiliation with that collectivity plays a constitutive role in the members' identity, thus underwriting their use of a nondistributive, collective we" (p. 193). This highly nuanced distinction draws (more implicitly than explicitly) from the dignitarian conclusions of Chapter 6, the collective entities conclusions of Chapter 7, and the identity-construction arguments of Part I.

The practical payoff we are supposed to derive from Chapter 8's inquiry turns on a larger, quasi-methodological norm within moral and political philosophy: in determining how it is permissible to treat various entities -- individual persons, collections of persons, collective entities, non-human animals, etc. -- whether deontological constraints apply turns on whether they are dignity-bearing entities. Happily, we do arrive at important and interesting conclusions in Chapters 9 and 10. Chapter 9 argues that consequentialist rationales both support and permit the punishment of business corporations, but that, because they are not bearers of dignity, certain deontological constraints on punishment need not be respected. Chapter 10, addressing the free speech rights of collective entities, provides an extraordinarily nuanced discussion. It distinguishes commercial organizations (notably, business corporations), expressive organizations (e.g., trade unions, NGOs), and protective organizations (e.g., universities), and communal organizations (e.g., families). Both original free speech rights and derivative rights of a variety of forms are attributed in a complex matrix (p. 231) to these different kinds of collective entities: only communal organizations enjoy original free speech rights akin to those of an individual human being. The surprising, but legally plausible, conclusion of the chapter is that "government speech" does not fit neatly into any one of these categories, and therefore will require nuanced analysis (of a sort Dan-Cohen commences) in a variety of different First Amendment contexts.

The unpretentiousness of Dan-Cohen's book and the philosophical pleasures of reading its elegant analyses tend to suppress cynicism, but I think a cynical standpoint is a useful heuristic device. So let us look at the harsh words of Prof. Yksrupiz Nimajneb:

Normative Subjects is a clever concatenation of everything today's sophisticated and progressive law professor would like to believe. It bashes Citizens United and protection for corporate free speech rights but still leaves the government free to moralize about political correctness. It embraces strong constitutional criminal procedural protections for the weak little guy, but applauds nearly unrestrained versions of corporate criminal law. While rejecting the too-transcendental noumenal world of Kant as well as the tawdrier approaches of utilitarianism, it nonetheless settles on dignity-based categorical imperative that supposedly flows from modest, anti-metaphysical and existentialist premises (leaving room for the preciousness of the aesthete, ambivalently admiring Gauguin). And while the categorical demands of dignity, as part of humanity, provide a promising basis for cosmopolitanism, there is still a special kind of dignitary protection for the group memberships that lie at the heart of contemporary identity politics. Dan-Cohen's mélange of political and philosophical views is just too good to be true. And, indeed, he has not come close to establishing that it is true, for what Dan-Cohen has provided is not a set of sound arguments for the substance of each of these positions, but simply a framework within which one can see how these positions could be held.[5]

As I will argue below, there is much that is unfair in Nimajneb's critique, but it does appear to identify a basic component of Dan-Cohen's view that might be criticized. Establishing the availability of a set of views seems too weak. And that is because of what is unsaid: that under Dan-Cohen's nearly existentialist ontology of the person, much will turn on what a person embraces as his or her identity. Even if Dan-Cohen is correct in his Wittgensteinian point that identities and affiliations are to a substantial extent creations external to an individual's private world, derived from a publicly available stock of roles and identities, there is a great variety of such identities and roles. It is hard to see what stands in the way of an individual's identification as a religious fundamentalist or a cultural relativist or innumerable other, radically different conceptions of the self. To put the point perhaps somewhat too forcefully, Dan-Cohen's simultaneous interest in the normative subjects of individual person and political community calls to mind The Republic (as he notes), but the emphasis on self-definition seems millions of miles from the metaphysics to which Plato was ultimately led to defend his substantive normative account.

Nimajneb's critique is unfair because he has forgotten that Dan-Cohen has self-consciously put forward a series of essays as much as or more than a unified book. His project is not to offer a systematic defense of a set of positions, whether or not those positions are associated with certain strands of contemporary liberalism. It simply explores several different thoughtful positions, providing rich analyses that deepen understanding. A fair-minded critique should engage these arguments one by one. Moreover, Dan-Cohen's work belongs to a genre (like that of Williams) that virtually begins with a sort of skepticism regarding the metaphysical and epistemological resources of contemporary moral and political theory. It is therefore far from trivial to establish that the sort of view he sketches is available and indeed coherent. The real question posed by Nimajneb is whether the smaller sized philosophical inquiries into normative subjects do reach cogent positions and, more importantly, whether they display the capacity of such analysis to move the ball forward in ways that matter.

With the particularity of normative problems in mind, I turn to an area of special concern to those who study corporate malfeasance: legal sanctions for business corporations, and whether they should be understood in a purely consequentialist manner. Dan-Cohen curiously overlooks a disturbing paradox that (to me) jumped out from his analysis. If the deontic side of punishment has (as he plausibly claims) a great deal to do with the dignity of the victim of the crime, then it is difficult to accept that the deontic side must be missing when the perpetrator is a business corporation. Certainly, individuals who have been injured by serious corporate wrongdoing -- imagine consumers badly burned in fires caused by defectively designed automobiles or retirees defrauded by banks of their life savings -- have been treated in a way that violates their dignity. Just because there is a sense in which a company cannot fully be respected as a person (because it is not a dignity bearer), it does not follow that a victim cannot be fully respected as a victim. Since Dan-Cohen's own account of the need for punishment highlights the victim role in particular, it is puzzling that he seems content to leave that aspect of punishment out of the picture for victims of corporate crime.

Of course, one way to look at Dan-Cohen's proposal is to say that the state has greater liberty to punish corporate defendants because they lack dignity-based procedural rights; if victims need vindication from corporate crime, prosecutors are therefore more able, not less able, to obtain it. This response does not seem to ring true, however. Part of the social meaning of punishment -- and, indeed, part of the reason it can count as vindication -- is that the imposition of what would normally be mistreatment on a person because of a crime he committed is a recognition of the victim's dignity. A denial of the perpetrator's moral personhood seems to preclude the possibility of corporate punishment serving its important vindicative role. More bluntly, the possibility of turning harmful actors into non-moral persons who lack dignity seems to ensure that a variety of victims will not enjoy the vindication to which they are entitled. Whether some version of the form of the civil remedy known as punitive damages can fill this gap -- as Anthony Sebok has, in effect, suggested[6] -- is an interesting question, one that Dan-Cohen's analysis nicely frames.

Whether on the one-book or on the many-essays reading, Meir Dan-Cohen's book is challenging and philosophically rich in all the best ways. Its more ethereal Kantian aspects are leavened by his lawyerly knowledge, and its sensible humanism is deepened by his capacity for trenchant philosophical analysis. One hopes that its essays will provide opportunities for careful critique and its book-like qualities will invite ambitious philosophical theory constructors in years to come.

[1] Harry Frankfurt, Takings Ourselves Seriously and Getting It Right, Debra Satz, ed. (Stanford University Press, 2006).

[2] Bernard Williams, "Moral Luck," in Moral Luck (Cambridge University Press, 1982), 20.

[3] Jeremy Waldron, Dignity, Right and Rank: The Tanner Lectures by Jeremy Waldron, Meir Dan-Cohen, ed. (Oxford University Press, 2012).

[4] See, e.g., Stephen Darwall, The Second-Person Standpoint (Harvard University Press, 2006).

[5] This fictional academic, YKSRUPIZ NIMAJNEB, typically sees things backwards.

[6] See, e.g., Anthony J. Sebok, Punitive Damages: from Myth to Theory, 92 Iowa L. Rev. 957 (2007).