Normativity and Naturalism in the Philosophy of the Social Sciences

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Mark Risjord (ed.), Normativity and Naturalism in the Philosophy of the Social Sciences, Routledge, 2016, 272pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138936621.

Reviewed by Francesco Guala, University of Milan


The domain of philosophy has been shrinking over time, partly as a consequence of its divorce from theology, but mainly because of the constant growth of scientific knowledge. It is impossible today to talk competently about venerable topics like space, time, life, or the 'soul' while ignoring the discoveries made by physicists, biologists and cognitive scientists. One set of topics, nevertheless, seems to remain out of scientists' reach: the domain of the normative, or the realm of the 'ought'. Sociologists and historians of course have a lot to say about the way we came to believe, for example, that slavery is wrong; but they cannot tell us why it is immoral to buy and sell human beings. Psychologists similarly can tell us why we reason in conformity with Bayes' theorem in some circumstances and not in others, but they cannot tell us that the Bayesian way is the correct way to make inductive inferences.

Plausible as it may seem, this division of labour (scientists work on what is, philosophers on what ought to be) is unstable. What are exactly philosophers experts about? Is there a realm of the normative that is separate and independent from the realm of natural facts? If so, what is it exactly? Faced with such questions, some philosophers have chosen an attacking style of play: they have argued that not only are there normative facts, but they also play an ineliminable role in our understanding of many ordinary phenomena. The idea is that knowledge of the correctness of some rule or practice provides also an explanation of why people apply that rule or conform to that practice. Take Adam, for example, who has promised Beth that he would meet her in the cafeteria. When his friend Carl asks him if he's up for a game of tennis, Adam declines, even though he would prefer to play tennis than talk to Beth. The reason he goes to the cafeteria is that he ought to do it -- he has an obligation to honour the promise he has made.

Call this position explanatory normativism. Various versions of explanatory normativism have become prominent in the philosophy of action, mind, language and ethics, thanks to the work of philosophers like Donald Davidson, Robert Brandom, and Christine Korsgaard. But no sub-field of philosophy has been more affected by it than the philosophy of social science. In the philosophy of social science the stakes of normativism are high because the opposition is -- or appears to be -- rather weak. Since the social sciences are ranked low in the pecking order of science, normativists have felt entitled to dismiss the seemingly plausible idea that every behaviour, practice, or rule, can be explained without appealing to any standard of correctness. Normativist philosophers moreover have formed an alliance with discontented social scientists who believe that social science cannot flourish unless it is enriched with an injection of normative theory. We must put more ethics in economics, more political philosophy in political science, and more 'social theory' (i.e. normative philosophy) in sociology (see e.g. Putnam and Walsh, 2012).

The 1990s were the peak years of explanatory normativism. As the project took shape and proselytized, however, the opposition regrouped. Part of the job of naturalistically inclined philosophers of social science consisted in disentangling the often elliptical, oblique arguments made by the normativists. Stephen Turner's monograph Explaining the Normative (2010) is a paradigmatic example of this naturalistic literature. Turner identifies a standard argument pattern that lies beneath most defenses of explanatory normativism. First, a phenomenon is described in such a way as to emphasize its normative aspects (the correctness of Adam's behaviour, for example). Second, the most obvious non-normative explanations of that phenomenon are shown to be inadequate. Third, by way of 'transcendental' reasoning, the necessity of appealing to an irreducibly normative principle is inferred, on pain of leaving some aspect of the social world unexplained. Turner does a good job at exposing the weaknesses of this strategy. He highlights in particular the normativists' dubious reliance on heavy redescription (step one), and the problem of underdetermination (steps two and three: for every normative explanation there is always a non-normative, less mysterious alternative). He also illuminates the historical context and general cultural significance of the normativist project, a movement of resistance against the 'disenchantment' of the social world that was promoted by scientists following in the steps of Max Weber.

One way of reading this edited volume is as a continuation of the debate triggered by Turner's book. After Mark Risjord's useful introduction, two chapters outline and defend the naturalist and the normativist positions. In chapter two Turner applies his debunking strategy to the views of two prominent contemporary normativists -- Joseph Raz and Korsgaard -- who had escaped his attention in Explaining the Normative. In the subsequent chapter Joseph Rouse counter-attacks, highlighting a tension between our ambition to explain the world scientifically, and our capacity of rational understanding, a tension that he tries to alleviate by means of a theory based on the notion of 'niche construction'. Both chapters are short and dense, and in spite of Paul Roth's valiant attempt to assess the debate in chapter four, those readers who are not already familiar with the earlier literature will find Rouse's theory particularly difficult to digest.

Luckily the rest of the volume does not require much background knowledge. Chapter by chapter, the reader is given an overview of the key issues that divide the naturalist and normativist camps. As Risjord explains in the introduction, it is by no means obvious that such a divide exists, because 'many of the authors in this volume who are described as normativist . . . accept some form of epistemological naturalism. The problem is whether they can coherently do so' (p. 4).

It is clear that once the most radical (and implausible) versions of the two positions are disposed of, the debate revolves around subtle disagreements. In an extremely lucid chapter David Henderson distinguishes various forms of naturalism and normativism according to their conception of the metaphysical relation that holds between normative and natural facts. The reasonable middle-ground that he identifies requires the existence of a naturalistic, non-mysterious relation of supervenience that is able to explain the emergence of normative properties from natural ones. The bad news, according to Henderson, is that no such relation is able to give the normativist what she wants: no universally valid, unconditional, non-contingent 'ought' can emerge from 'is' by means of purely natural (e.g. causal) mechanisms. No complex entanglement of beliefs about what is obligatory or permissible, for example, will ever be able to give us what is really obligatory or permissible.

If the moderate ground is not a viable solution, then we are left with two radical options: either we postulate an irreducible but mysterious source of normativity; or we deny that 'genuine' normativity exists in a world of natural facts. For those philosophers who, like Henderson, endorse the disenchantment project, this is a no-brainer. But many other contributors who attempt to untangle the relationship between normative and natural facts end up with the same result. Mark Okrent for example summarises a story about the emergence of normativity that has become familiar thanks to the work of Fred Dretske, Ruth Millikan, and other philosophers of biology (none of them, oddly, are quoted here). The behaviours of individual organisms under the pressure of natural selection can be divided into different classes depending on their success in promoting fitness. This division into 'right' and 'wrong' behaviours is only a theorist's classification, of course; but if some of these organisms (agents) develop systems of representation of the outcomes of their actions, they will also probably develop the twin notions of right and wrong.

So far, so good. The tricky step for the naturalist is to go beyond this level of purely natural, instrumental norms, and explain the creation of unconditional norms, norms that are valid regardless of their instrumental value for the decision-maker. The story at this point tends to go like this: young individuals are trained by their peers until they acquire a disposition to apply some norms unconditionally (for example, until they acquire 'morality'). Those who do not internalize the norms are excluded from certain social roles, or, in the most extreme cases, from the community itself. Thus the reality of unconditional normativity can be explained within a naturalistic framework. But what the naturalistic story explains of course is the emergence of a disposition to treat some norms as if they were unconditional, non-instrumental, universally valid. Nothing in the story justifies the stronger claim that such norms really are universally valid, unconditional, and so forth.

Karsten Stueber  tries to get normativity out of the box by taking a slightly different route. He notices that in the process of trying to understand each other we are often led to take an 'impartial spectator' perspective, that is, we look for justifications of action that are not subjectively biased. Although Steuber does not give concrete examples, I take his idea to be the following: when Jack tries to understand Jill's decision to be a vegetarian, he cannot just 'put himself in Jill's shoes' (i.e. simulate the reasoning and emotional processes that lead to her decision not to eat any meat). He is also compelled to justify his own behaviour, or, which is equivalent, to evaluate Jill's reasons as objective reasons. During this process of evaluation, facts become normatively charged. The normativity is intrinsic, but depends constitutively on a specific stance taken by the agents. Since the stance is a natural fact, the emergence of normativity is compatible with naturalism.

And yet, again, the question is whether the normativist would be satisfied by this story. Steuber seems to be overly optimistic regarding the general validity of the emergent norms. If reasons and norms emerge from a process of mutual understanding and mutual validation of action, then they may be moulded to fit the goals of the agents who are involved, and eventually are likely to reflect contingent power relations. (As an example, consider the initial limited application of the ideals enshrined in the American constitution, to the exclusion of black people and women. Or the current exclusion of animals from the moral compact of our society.) The only way to preserve the distinctive core of normativism -- the idea that genuine norms are explanatory -- seems to be the postulation of an irreducible moral or rational principle that is acquired in a non-standard way, or in other words, that is not hostage to the contingency of social practices, beliefs, and their historical trajectories.

All these authors are engaged in the difficult project of outlining how normative facts may emerge from natural facts. But this is by no means the only or the most common way to defend normativism. A popular strategy of explanatory normativists has been to argue that the social sciences themselves are embued with normative notions and make constant use of them when they explain behaviour. (Turner calls it the tu quoque argument.) Moreover, such normative notions are ineliminable -- no explanation of behaviour qua behaviour is possible that makes use of purely non-evaluative terms.

A few chapters are devoted to the tu quoque strategy. This requires the detailed study of social scientific practice, something that many normativist philosophers are not particularly keen to do, but that young philosophers of science have learnt to do very well. Julie Zahle for example examines the case of 'participant observation', a methodology that is widely used in anthropology and sociology, and that is often invoked in support of anti-naturalistic positions. She tackles various versions of the 'uniqueness' thesis, namely, that participant observation is unique to social science and relies on a non-naturalistic style of explanation. For every version of the uniqueness thesis, Zahle shows that either a similar method to participant observation is used in the natural sciences, or that there is an alternative method that makes the non-naturalistic one unnecessary.

The most powerful weapon in the normativist's arsenal however is the theory of rational choice. The alleged necessity to assume that human behaviour is rational has been used to challenge naturalism ever since the Methodenstreit of the late nineteenth century, and Davidson later made it a centerpiece of his 'anomalous monism'. The enormous success of rational choice theory during the last fifty years has posed a problem for naturalists because this research programme seems committed to the controversial methodological principles of explanatory inequality and explanatory fundamentalism. Inequality, in Petri Ylikoski and Jaakko Kuorikoski's terminology, is the thesis that two radically different types of explanation are appropriate for rational and irrational behaviour. Fundamentalism adds that rational action (unlike its opposite) does not require any further explanation. No psychology or sociology is needed to explain why agents do what is normatively correct.

Ylikoski and Kuorikoski do a great job at demolishing these two ideas. Their main argument is that both are incompatible with the principles of causal explanation that constitute the bulk of scientific practice, as well as the ideal aim of the social sciences. Moreover, inequality and fundamentalism bias scientific research by influencing the way experiments are designed, the choice of explananda, and the heuristics used by scientists to construct their theories. To bolster these critical points, in the second part of their essay Ylikoski and Kuorikoski sketch an alternative approach that would satisfy explanatory symmetry while rejecting fundamentalism. Dale Miller's (1999) hypothesis of rationality as a social norm offers a potential explanation of why people behave rationally (when they do), and constitutes a promising research agenda that is entirely consistent with the naturalists' desiderata. Rational self-interest according to this programme is not a principle of explanation to be justified a priori (transcendentally) but a contingent phenomenon that is itself liable to historical, sociological, and possibly biological explanation.

There are many other chapters that cannot be mentioned here for lack of space, but that nevertheless deserve to be read carefully by philosophers and social scientists interested in these topics. My overall impression is that none of the arguments in this volume will change the mind of a naturalist who -- like the author of this review -- thinks that the scientific worldview only leaves room for 'weak' (i.e. contingent, contextual) normativity. I cannot say whether believers in 'strong' normativity and explanatory normativism will be similarly unshaken. This nice volume edited by Risjord in any case clarifies how hard the job of the normativist has become, how the disenchantment project has progressively eroded the domain of the normative, to the extent that its very existence has become dubious. Undoubtedly normativists will continue to produce ingenious arguments to preserve the idea that philosophy can not only survive or co-exist with, but even compete with science. In order to do that, they will have to engage seriously with the many conceptual and empirical obstacles that are laid out in this volume.


Miller, Dale. 1999. "The norm of self-interest." American Psychologist 54: 1053-1060.

Putnam, Hilary and Walsh, Vivian. (eds.) 2012. The End of Value-Free Economics. Routledge.

Turner, Stephen. 2010. Explaining the Normative. Polity.