Normativity and Phenomenology in Husserl and Heidegger

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Steven Crowell, Normativity and Phenomenology in Husserl and Heidegger, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 321pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107682559.

Reviewed by Dermot Moran, University College Dublin


Steven Crowell's latest monograph is a careful and nuanced thematic and historically grounded defense of the philosophical importance of what is now frequently called "classical" phenomenology (specifically Husserl and Heidegger) in addressing the issues of meaning, normativity, agency and first-person knowledge, topics central to contemporary analytic philosophy of mind and action. This well argued book situates Husserl and Heidegger not just at the center of contemporary debates in the philosophy of mind and action, but also as interlocutors in current disputes over normativity and practical knowledge (as found in the neo-pragmatism of John McDowell and Robert Brandom, among others), as well as the current discussions concerning first-person authority and mental content.

Crowell is not just conversant with the intricacy of the texts of Husserl and Heidegger (whom he reads with detailed documentation as in substantial agreement with one another), but also with a wide range of figures in contemporary philosophy of mind, moral psychology, and neo-pragmatism, including John Searle, Hubert Dreyfus, Alva Noë, Richard Moran (no relation), and Christine Korsgaard). In the course of his interpretations of Husserl and Heidegger, moreover, Crowell has a lot of instructive (and corrective) things to say about such issues as mental content, internalism and externalism, causation, the relation between perception and conception, the connection between self-consciousness and normativity, the transparency and immediacy of self-knowledge (in an interesting engagement with Moran) and the meaning of agency (including moral agency) in relation to Heidegger's notion of authenticity. This is a very rich, often dense but never less than lucid book that offers a systematic defense of phenomenology in the language of contemporary philosophy and thereby achieves a double objective, namely to set a new agenda for phenomenological discussion in the twenty-first century and to show why analytic philosophers would be wrong to neglect the phenomenological heritage.

Crowell offers a demystified account of phenomenology. According to him, phenomenology is involved not so much in a cognitive as in a semantic project; it is a descriptive, clarificatory, eidetic inquiry into meaning or sense (Sinn), although this meaning is not limited to what is linguistic nor should it be construed solely as identical with Husserlian abstract idealities or Fregean ideal senses. Phenomenology has its own complex approach to meaning as an outcome of human comportment, which is approached through the basic assumption of the intentionality of human conscious life and action. Crowell contends that, although Husserl focused primarily on consciousness and Heidegger on the meaning of Being, in fact both are concerned with the conditions of the possibility of meaning disclosure in all its forms. Meaning has to be understood as essentially intentional, the experience of something as something, how it appears to someone. As Crowell tells the story, Husserl approaches meaning through the relation between intention and fulfillment; Heidegger interprets intentionality (ontic transcendence) as grounded in the prior ontological transcendence of Dasein. In this sense, Crowell sides with Heidegger: transcendence precedes all other forms of comportment. Crowell concedes that Husserl retains a rather old-fashioned "metaphysical" conception of transcendental subjectivity with which he seems to be uncomfortable. Crowell sees problems inherent in Husserl's account of transcendental subjectivity; Husserl both identifies transcendental subjectivity with the person and at the same time makes the person a constituted achievement of transcendental subjectivity. Crowell rightly regards this as incoherent (p. 163).

Although Crowell offers a benign reading, which largely disperses with the metaphysical worries, nevertheless, he allows that Husserl does think that nothing essential to the constitution of meaning lies outside of transcendental consciousness. Crowell sides with Heidegger in seeing Husserl's "consciousness" as an inadequate term of the field of transcendental experience, and he gives a penetrating account of what is involved in Heidegger's Dasein and its care structure. Being in the world is not exactly the same as subjectivity. Crowell's own position is closer to the "existential" stance of Heidegger who reinterprets Dasein's transcendence as the kind of commitment to which Dasein itself submits voluntarily. To be human is to commit oneself to living according to the norms of one's chosen position. Accountability requires already recognizing the normative claim on oneself and responding to it in some way. Heidegger's characterization of Dasein as care already recognizes Dasein's normativity.

Both Husserlian intentionality and Heideggerian transcendence involve normativity, and much of Crowell's book is an explanation of what this means. As Crowell explains, Husserlian phenomenology sees all "reality" as essentially a set of meaning-formations, "unities of meaning" as Husserl calls them. The intentional object is best understood as a normatively governed structure of meaning. To take the classic case of the perceived object, the front side of the seen object implies (according to an order of intentional implication rather than logical inference) the back side. This is not the same as logical entailment; rather, there is a sense of being carried along to apprehend the excess or overflow involved in perception and to understand that there is a set of conditions governing what can be apprehended in a continuation of the perception.

The book is divided into four parts. Part One is entitled "Transcendental Philosophy, Phenomenology, and Normativity"; Part Two "Husserl on Consciousness and Intentionality"; Part Three "Heidegger, Care, and Reason"; and Part Four "Phenomenology and Practical Philosophy". Part One interprets phenomenology as an expansion of the Kantian transcendental project: an inquiry into the normative conditions for the possibility of intentional meaning that respects the first-person starting-point. Crowell begins by presenting intentional meaning as the central theme of phenomenology. He also defends the methodological turn that phenomenology takes in imposing the epoché and reduction. Crowell sees the epoché as necessary to uncouple the naïve realism of the natural attitude and allow meaning to be apprehended in an original manner. The epoché means suspension of commitment to the world, especially to the being of nature (pp. 95-96). The epoché highlights the essential subjective dimension to meaning. In this regard Crowell resolutely defends a transcendental approach; he is concerned with the a priori conditions of possibility for meaning and for normativity.

Crowell insists that all phenomenology is normative. This pits him directly against naturalistic approaches (although he recognizes some weak forms of naturalism that are not hostile to the normativity of meaning may live comfortably with phenomenology). Phenomenology is concerned with meaning. Meaning has to include the intention to mean, what Paul Ricoeur calls "vouloir dire". In a very special sense, phenomenology is about manifestness or disclosure; meanings are disclosed to subjects who are uniquely disposed to apprehend them. One could say that Crowell is seeking conditions of adequacy for this meaning disclosure. Husserl, for instance, wants to specify the a priori laws applying to all forms of meaning or sense constitution as such. Heidegger, on the other hand, understands human subjectivity in terms of its responsiveness or answerability. We give ourselves the possibility of commitment and thereby make our own meaning, as it were. This challenges any form of naturalism that wants to think of mental states purely as component pieces of the world. As Crowell puts it, how can a mental state have the structure of a claim? The nature of the normative claim has to be related to a being already attuned to the normative domain.

At the outset Crowell defines a norm broadly as any criterion for success or failure. The normative includes (as in the Kantian tradition) concepts, essences, Platonic exemplars, and so on. What it means to say that meaning is essentially normative is that the apprehending subject is responding to claims it apprehends as holding for it or demanded of it. In Husserl's terms, intentional consciousness is normative because intentionality involves conditions of correctness, success or failure, fulfillment, even responsiveness in the appropriate way. Philosophy, as Husserl clearly states and as Heidegger concurs, is about self-responsibility, and self-responsibility means acting on the basis of reasons or motivations one has identified as compelling for oneself. This, for Crowell, is the basis of the demand for self-evidence in phenomenology. There is a demand for evidential responsibility -- the claims of others are empty until fulfilled by my first-personal evidence. Husserl puts an emphasis on "seeing for oneself". Empty intentions have to be swopped for intuitions given with fullness or evidence.

Crowell re-interprets Kant's famous question (as Kant puts it in his Letter to Marcus Herz) -- "how can a representation hit its object?" -- as really asking a rather different question: "how can we do it correctly?" Crowell also wants to side with a specific reading of Kant's project that keeps the "anthropological" dimension involved in the "subjective" deduction of the A-version of the Critique of Pure Reason, rather than going in the Neo-Kantian direction of being preoccupied with the form of transcendental arguments as such. While this is sometimes referred to as the "psychological" reading, Husserl and Heidegger are resolutely anti-psychological in their understanding of the transcendental subject. Crowell's account is particularly useful because of his detailed background knowledge of the Neo-Kantian tradition -- from Rickert, Lask, and Natorp to McDowell. Natorp, for instance, interpreted the Platonic forms as "laws" (Gesetze). Concepts in some sense involve rules, and meaning for Crowell always involves a set of normative demands, constraints, criteria, commitments, and other non-factual requirements that can only make sense if one envisages a subject who both apprehends and feels the force of these demands. Subjects have to be able to respond appropriately to claims made on them. Crowell emphasizes, further, that self-understanding -- as someone tasked to do something -- is also necessarily involved.

Norms, furthermore, are embedded in human behavior, comportment, skills, abilities, or practices. Crucially, Crowell claims:

A norm of what is appropriate can be present in consciousness only because it is first there in the exercise of certain abilities, skills and instituted practices. (p. 26)

Crowell places a strong emphasis on Husserl's practical or pragmatic understanding of intentionality to refute claims (found in Dreyfus, Taylor Carman and others) that he is overly Cartesian in his approach. The way Crowell reads him, Husserl's practical understanding is quite close to Heidegger's understanding of Dasein's pre-theoretical involvements (Heidegger's untranslatable Bewandtnisse) that do not involve explicit judgments (p. 25). A normative moment belongs to abilities, skills and practices, because "they belong to a being who can acknowledge them as such conditions" (p. 28). This is a crucial Kantian claim on the meaning of rationality and its essential connection to self-reflexivity and freedom (the possibility of giving the law to oneself).

As I have been suggesting, Crowell discusses the meaning and development of Husserl's phenomenology in a way as to bring his project closer to that of Heidegger. Husserl's fate (partly due to his own presentations in Ideas and in Cartesian Meditations) was to be considered a modern Cartesian foundationalist. Indeed, even contemporary commentators sympathetic to the European tradition of philosophy, such as Dreyfus, have condemned Husserl in precisely these terms, in this regard following the lead of Heidegger. But Crowell defends a broader and, I would say, more accurate picture of Husserl, including three further elements in his discussion, namely: embodiment, sociality and history. Embodiment and a capacity to act are already implied in the very structure of perception. The body's capacity to act, its "I can" as Husserl calls it, is needed to understand in what sense absent profiles of perceptual objects are somehow already there in the act of perceiving. Furthermore, the body itself is constituted and is embedded in its social and historical horizon and milieu. As becomes clear in the discussion of Husserl's supposed internalism (using the language made popular by Putnam's essay about meanings being "in the head") about meaning, human beings are essentially social and historical. The history of one's experience has to be recognized. Thus thought experiments such as Donald Davidson's swampman are a priori impossible for phenomenologists. Human being and swampman do not share the same narrow content because they do not share the same histories (p. 122).

In Chapter Five, which is in my view a veritable tour de force, Crowell rejects the appropriateness of the labels of internalism and externalism, as applying to Husserl and Heidegger, in a discussion that invokes Searle, Brandom and Putnam, among others (Incidentally, Crowell also rejects inferentialism as a kind of behaviorism that abandons first-person stance). What is wrong with thinking of Husserl as an internalist is the adoption of a misleading Fregean interpretation of the noema. Carman, for instance, has argued that Husserl is an internalist oriented not towards real things in the world but towards noemas (or noemata) understood as abstract Fregean senses. Heidegger, on the other hand, according to the same interpretation, is seen as an externalist, for whom meanings are encountered in the world, a consequence of Dasein as being-in-the-world. Heidegger, for instance, says that for Dasein there is no outside and hence no inside (p. 108). For Crowell, Husserl's supposed internalism and Heidegger's supposed externalism cannot really be contrasted. The picture is falsely drawn. Husserl is not an internalist in the traditional sense about meaning. Internalism is usually understood as the view that intentional content is fully determined by mental content (in the head), but, Crowell argues, the noema is neither in the world nor in the head; it is a transcendental concept. The noema is the object as apprehended by the subject. It is neither something externally real or internally ideal. Crowell also makes the important point that Heidegger nowhere explicitly repudiates the Husserlian noema.

In a discussion of the normative character of perception, Crowell also tackles the issue of the inherent conceptuality of perception. Must perception always involve a seeing that, i.e., a moment of conceptuality and judgment? Crowell interprets and defends Husserl for holding the view that perception is non-conceptual and "proto-logical" (p. 44). Perceptions, of course, are taken up in judgments, but, on their own, their role is to fulfill judgments (p. 38). Not everything in perceiving is a judging. Fulfillment, in this Husserlian sense, is not to merely present a sense datum, as traditional accounts of perception often claim, but to provide the experience of self-presence of whatever kind. In this sense, fulfillment is a relative notion, and each case must be examined on its own merits. Perception as a temporal process requires an organizing principle and hence a norm inbuilt into the perception itself. Perception cannot be pure "sentience", to employ Brandom's terms, but must involve a capacity for fulfilling an intention. Perceptual intentionality, for Crowell, is "individual, non-symbolic, and pre-predicative" (p. 131), but it can later be taken up and articulated in predicative judgments.

Crowell places great emphasis on the empty intention/fulfillment structure of perceptual experience. In perception, the front side is presented, but the back side of a material object is also presented at the very same time, but in a manner that is indeterminate, not as mere empty possibility but as an "incomplete determinacy" (p. 132). We have, to borrow Noë's term, a perceptual sense of the back side. The appearing presentative contents (Husserl's darstellende Inhalte, i.e., those sensory qualities that appear but whose job is to point beyond themselves to something else) appear as signs for a range of other possible contents. Husserl uses the language of referring, indicating, implying, but how can sensations function as signs? Crowell even records that Husserl wonders if perceptual apprehensions are not conceptual in a certain way (p. 133). There is a moment of universality in a perception -- something like a type. In fact, in a careful and illuminating discussion, Crowell claims that Husserl's early theory of perception (e.g., in Logical Investigations and Thing and Space) is inconclusive on the role of conceptuality in perception. In his later work, however, Husserl replaces the grasp-content (Auffassung-Inhalt) account with an apperception in which the other sides are motivated and interplay between anticipations and fulfillment (p. 137). In regards to the manner in which perceptual experience is embedded in a social and historical context, Crowell has wonderful descriptions of the life-world as "a complex interplay of memory and forgetting, of faithful transmission and fateful emptying of original experiences and intentional accomplishments" (p. 56).

Crowell explores the phenomenological position on the immediacy and transparency of self-knowledge states with the help of some distinctions borrowed from Richard Moran. Moran holds -- and Crowell thinks Husserl and Heidegger would both agree -- that justificatory reasons have priority over explanatory reasons. In fact, this is a condition for being a person for Moran. Rational responsibility requires being able to identify one's beliefs as one's own first-person authority is reconstructed in terms of agent-based deliberative stance.

Part Four on the existential sources of normativity examines Husserl and Heidegger on intentional action and practical engagement, and argues strongly for meaning as connected to agency. For Crowell, Heidegger is interested in clarifying what is means to be a genuine agent. Dasein is care (Sorge) and primarily is concerned about his or her own existence; rationality is secondary. Crowell contrasts Kant and Heidegger in terms of responding to a call. For Heidegger, one does not respond because of recognition of the intrinsic rationality of the call. Authenticity, on Crowell's interpretation of Heidegger, means recognition that I am responsible for the normative force the norms have on me. Heidegger is interested in Aristotle's phronesis, as Gadamer and others have pointed out, but Crowell makes clear that Heidegger departs from Aristotle in his account of the place of practical wisdom in human action. Phronesis is not fundamental for Heidegger -- conscience is. Indeed, the section on Heidegger's understanding of conscience is one of the deepest and most original aspects of this book. Action according to Heidegger is essentially "conscience-less" until it is taken over by conscience. Crowell clarifies that this accordance to norms does not necessarily involve deliberation and can be an immediate response to a situation. Heidegger does not say much about deliberation. Deliberation is for him embedded in specific practices. Deliberation is the thinking part of one's embeddedness in a situation.

It is impossible in the course of a short review to do justice to the richness and originality of Crowell's analysis. The work is genuinely systematic, although the essay style (versions of many of the chapters appeared earlier as journal articles and chapters) does lead to a certain degree of repetition and fragmentation. I think Crowell has done a terrific job in highlighting the centrality of normativity and meaning within phenomenology and also the richness and originality of phenomenology's insights into these areas -- insights that can be mined fruitfully by contemporary analytic philosophy. Parts Three and Four of the book on the whole notion of being answerable (responsibility), on conscience as well as on agency, practical rationality and morality -- where Crowell explicates Heidegger in a very original manner -- is for me the most interesting and challenging part of the overall project. It is also the densest and will need considerable unpacking. The idea that one always deliberates from within a "practical identity" (which includes a set of norms to which I am already committed) seems to me compelling but needs much greater articulation if it is to be more than a radical individualism.

Finally, while re-articulating phenomenological insights in close proximity to the language of Pittsburgh neo-pragmatism has a great deal of hermeneutical value, there is a worry that Husserl's and Heidegger's ontological commitments will be diluted too much. Husserl was, despite all his emphasis on embodiment, sociality and embeddedness in a world and a history, an unrepenting transcendental idealist. Heidegger, furthermore, claimed not only to be aiming at a phenomenological ontology in Being and Time, but in his later work claimed to be primarily oriented to Being and the history of its "sending". This ontological side of phenomenology needs also to be kept in mind when thinking through issues of meaning and normativity. Heidegger himself came to realize that the concept of Dasein did not solve all the problems generated by Husserl's notion of transcendental subjectivity. There is then still the demanding issue of thinking through the meaning of subjectivity in its relation to being. But Crowell has begun a dialogue and opened up a new way of thinking about Husserl and Heidegger that deserves to be taken seriously both by phenomenologists and by contemporary philosophers of meaning, mind and action.