In this excellent collection of essays, most of which date since his 1996 book, Responsibility and the Moral Sentiments, R. Jay Wallace develops the moral psychology behind his Strawsonian account of moral responsibility as depending on our practices of holding people morally accountable. While several of the essays develop the conceptions of human agency and autonomy introduced in sections 3.1 and 5.2 of Responsibility and the Moral Sentiments; there are important innovations in his account of moral freedom and autonomy and a more detailed critique of Humean views.
The collection has three main parts. The first focuses on the kind of motivational and agentive powers that we must have if moral norms are to guide our practical deliberation (3). In the second, Wallace argues that the account of volition in Part I remains consistent with grounding responsibility in "rational powers" and does not imply that "freedom of the will" (in leeway or agent-causal senses) is required for moral responsibility (5). He also maintains that desires become autonomous when we reflectively affirm their normative content or ends, rather than affirming the desires themselves (7). The third part of the book defends a eudaimonistic account of moral norms and moral motivation against alternative accounts offered by John McDowell, T.M. Scanlon, Joseph Raz, and Michael Smith. The cumulative result is a systematic extension of the approach to agency and moral obligation developed in Wallace's earlier book that, while influenced by the work of Bernard Williams, clearly rejects Williams's neo-Humean internalism about motivation and attributes to us significant powers beyond those usually found in eudaimonistic accounts to human agency as well. This is first class philosophical work that cannot be ignored by anyone interested in the main issues of moral psychology today. Next to Korsgaard's and Dancy's accounts, it offers a distinctive third alternative within the broader anti-Humean camp.1 I would rank it equal with these other two in insight and depth of development
- and that is meant as high praise.
While all the essays are well-written and introduce novel ideas, I will leave Part III aside in order to comment in detail on Parts I and II, which contain most of the surprises for readers familiar with Wallace's earlier work on moral responsibility. Wallace insists that he is not abandoning his earlier compatibilism, and the account of volitional capacities he ties to normative guidance may not entail incompatibilist freedom, but his account of the will is nevertheless more robust than other leading compatibilist accounts, and it merits careful attention. In what follows, as is customary, I will concentrate more on objections than on my many points of strong agreement with Wallace. It will still be evident that I am in sympathy with many of his central theses, and generally persuaded that he is right to answer questions about human agency based on what we commonly think normative guidance requires.
Chapter I: Internalist-Externalist Debates
The first chapter reprints Wallace's survey of 20th century debates between Humeans and rationalists about practical reason prior to 1990. This essay is a model of clarity and is still very useful in cutting through so many confusions in this literature; it remains one of the best defenses of rationalism in the internalism-externalism debate. In it, Wallace improves Nagel's defense in response to Smith, Williams, and others. Given that the themes introduced in this essay set the stage for much in the later essays, some details are in order.
Wallace treats governance by norms as an explanatory but not necessarily a causal relation (15), and takes a thin version of "internalism" to be the thesis that moral requirements must "be capable of guiding behavior, leading those who are aware of the requirements to be motivated in accordance with them" (16). Wallace is right that this general internalist requirement does not support Humean conclusions unless combined with the further premise that all motivation traces to desires not themselves guided by reason; he later renames this general thesis that recognized practical reasons motivate agents who are rational, calling it the "motivation requirement" to distinguish it from Williams-style internalism (43). Wallace means this motivation requirement to be consistent with broadly Kantian approaches to practical reason. However, it may be inconsistent with Kant's own view that moral considerations do not pull on us like inclinations or operate as motives until we decide to act on them. I find the same problem in Korsgaard's formulation of generic internalism as holding that practical reasons succeed in motivating us insofar as we are rational (18): unless this is a tautology because being rational is defined as choosing to take practical reasons as motives, it suggests that rational agents feel their reasons to act as attracting them prior to intention-formation. The purer Kantian view is that we give moral reasons motivating force when we decide to act on them or embed them in our intentions: on this formulation, it is clear that reasons do not simply cause motives in us, insofar as we are rational.
But this minor worry aside, Wallace argues convincingly that we should focus on an a priori argument formulated by Michael Smith that reasons cannot provide a complete explanation of a rational agent's motives. This is the (now well-known) argument that action and intention are goal-directed, and thus have a different direction of fit than cognitive states like belief; therefore they cannot consist in or be fully explained by beliefs (19-20). This argument goes astray, in Wallace's view, when it is extended with the further assumption that reasoning only plays a cognitive role (20-21) and so cannot by itself explain any desires (26). Wallace tries to clarify Nagel's response to this a priori Humean argument by suggesting that what really divides Humeans and rationalists is the question of whether or not "desire" in the broad sense implied by any goal-directed intention can be formed in a way that is explained by propositional attitudes, so that the agent has a given desire or motive because a belief gives him a reason to have it (24) (without appealing to prior desires). In particular, evaluative beliefs are associated with desires and admit of rational justification that may also explain the formation of the associated desires; thus the teleological argument leaves open the possibility that the conative aspect of intentional action may in some cases be explained entirely (and rationalized) by "the agent's beliefs, together with rational principles or norms" (26).
I have slightly rephrased Wallace's way of putting this point for the following reason: when "desire" is used for whatever psychological state distinguishes goal-directedness from cognitive direction of fit, as in Nagel and in Smith's teleological argument, it seems just to be a synonym for "motivation;" in this usage, the proposition that every goal-directed state of mind involves "desire" is analytic rather than synthetic. Wallace notes, insightfully, that his way of blocking the a priori argument for Humean internalism presupposes that it is a basic norm of rationality that one should adjust one's desires to one's evaluative beliefs: we do not just happen to want our desires to be rationally justifiable, but instead have strong reason to want this. Rationalists must hold that this basic norm applies not only to beliefs about instrumental value, but also to value-judgments that justify and explain the formation of motivation to final ends (27): in both types of case, our motives should be guided by such reasons. Rationalists must also assume that basic principles about terminal value can be given rational justification independent of prior given motives (28-29). Thus in constructing his alternative to Humean views, Wallace does not (like Velleman or Mele) assume a basic desire to act rationally, but rather a norm requiring that we desire what is rationally desirable. For a brute desire to act rationally or to conform our motives to practical reason, even if innate, will not itself admit of any further "rationalizing explanation" in Wallace's sense (i.e. being both explained and justified by reasons to which the agent responds). In chapter XIV, in fact, Wallace criticizes such basic desires for rational agency as "arbitrary from the point of view of reason" or even fetishistic on anti-rationalist accounts, since these basic motives cannot be justified as right in themselves, let alone guided by such justification, for anti-rationalists (331). Wallace's alternative contrasts clearly with what he calls the distinctive thesis of Humean views, i.e. the "desire-out, desire-in" principle (DO-DI) according to which all desires (including desires influenced by rational norms) trace ultimately to basic desires that are beyond the reach of rationalizing explanation (30).
So far, Wallace is correct in my view: the central issue between Humeans and rationalists is DO-DI. He also gives convincing arguments that rationalists may reject this principle without viewing certain desires and beliefs as identical or necessarily connected (32), and that Hume's is-ought distinction depends on DO-DI rather than providing independent support for it. But I suggest that DO-DI can be decomposed into two more basic ideas from which it follows: the "transmission principle" (TP), which says that all purposive desires (or motivations involved in formed intentions) trace to prepurposive desires, and the subjective thesis (S) that basic or nonderivative prepurposive desires make no evaluative claim that can be justified and guided by independent practical norms that hold irrespective of one's desires.<!-[if !supportFootnotes]—>2 Note that the Aristotelian should reject S while still accepting TP, while a Kantian should reject both. If this is correct, then an Aristotelian accepts that one's practical reasons depend on deliberation from some basic desires that are not brought about by recognizing reasons for them (36), even though these desires involve evaluations; for example, the general desire for one's eudaimonia or well-being is not itself guided by practical reason. This helps explain why pictures of practical reasoning that look quite different from Hume's may accept a version of DO-DI. For example, if we have to start from a desire for fair terms of mutual cooperation or from a desire for flourishing to count as rational, then our practical reasoning may not be utilitarian, yet it still traces to a desire that is not rationally guided. Wallace is right that on such accounts, we cannot give a rationalizing explanation for how an amoralist comes to acquire ethically significant motives such as the desire for happiness or for justice (39). But this simply forces us to recognize that what really distinguishes the pure rationalist approach is the radical idea that at least some important motives (such as central moral motives) can be formed by the agent herself in light of what already operate for her as practical reasons independently of such moral motives.
This point has a crucial implication. Although in later chapters, Wallace describes his view of ethical norms as a kind of eudaimonism, his view actually implies that the agent can recognize good reasons to care about living well and decide to set this regulative final end for those reasons. This is a fundamental departure from the classical structure of motivational eudaimonism. In chapter I, Wallace does an excellent job defending the idea that some desires may be explained by rational guidance, but his positive account of it comes in the next chapter.
Chapter II: Volitionalism
In the 1999 essay that forms chapter II, Wallace begins by clarifying the general "motivation requirement" that "rational agents who grasp that they have reason to do x" all things considered "will be motivated accordingly" (44, see note 2). Although rationalists should agree with Humeans on this requirement, they add that this rational motive and action on it are"guided" by "deliberative reflection" on the recognized reasons. In other words, the intention and reasons don't simply align; the intention is formed for these reasons (52).3 This helps allay my earlier worry by making the agent actively link recognizing reasons to the corresponding motivation. Wallace argues that Humean "internalist" conceptions of practical reason do not allow for this kind of guidance because they construe deliberative reflection merely as triggering a prior motive "whose presence is a condition for one's having the reason in the first place." On this view, reasoning motivates due to "causal forces within us" rather than due to our own deliberative activity (48). "Meta-internalist" views do a bit better by tracing the motivational efficacy of deliberation to our having desires that are constitutional for our being rational agents at all, such as alleged desires to be autonomous, or to act rationally, or to act in ways that form an intelligible story (51). On these views, I can have a reason to perform an action of type T even if I do not have a "substantive" or particular desire that an act of this type promises to satisfy. But, like simple Humean internalists, meta-internalists cannot regard cases of akrasia or accidie, in which we fail to act as we believe we have most reason to act, as cases in which the basic desire(s) on which our rationality depends could have governed our action (54-55). This is because meta-internalist views retain the "hydraulic interpretation of human motivational psychology"(55), according to which practical reasons control our actions by connecting with beliefs to cause intentions (60). In other words, they remain versions of the familiar belief-desire schema, with its traditional "empiricist assumption" that all motivation traces to motives with respect to which "we are basically passive" (50-51).
By contrast, "volitionalism" is the conception of rational agency according to which decisions and the intentions they form are "motivational states that are directly subject to our immediate control" and themselves constitute a type of action (58). It is important to distinguish this from "volitionalism" in Robert Audi's sense, which stands for a class of theories holding that trying to act on an already-formed intention, or trying to form a more particular bodily intention to enact one's plan, is the basic function of willing. On some of these accounts, conations or tryings are even identified with forming intentions. Instead, Wallace's account of volition is similar to what Thomas Pink calls decision-making as a type of second-order act that generates a persisting motivation to act as intended for reasons (thus applying reasons to actions through forming plans).4 Following ideas from Robert Kane and Pink, I have recently called this the "executive agency" concept of willing.5 Wallace shows how this model provides an alternative account of "guidance" in which action is intentional (done for reasons) when it is "directly controlled by the agent's own deliberative grasp of what they have reason to do" (49). Unlike Pink, Wallace does not require that deciding be instrumentally rational in order to count as active or as a function of agency.
At this point, three closely related questions arise. First, the internalist will perhaps protest that demanding this kind of direct control by agents (rather than by the interaction of passive desires and beliefs, or by ultimately passive yet specifiable desires constitutive of rationality) begs the question against "hydraulic" models of control; for it at least seems to suggest some type of agent-causation. Similarly, if "practical irrationality and rational agency are two sides of the same coin" in the sense that an adequate account of intentional action must allow for both (49), and thus rational agents "could have done what they ought, holding fixed the desires and dispositions to which they were subject when they chose to do otherwise" and acted akratically (59), then rational guidance also seems to entail leeway-liberty.6 Wallace does not accept exactly these implications, as we will see. Second, how can rational guidance through maxims (60) constitute control unless the incorporation of reasons into intentions is something that the agent brings about in making decisions? As Mele has argued, control seems to be an inherently causal notion. The "fact of the matter about the content of the intention with which the agent acts" (61) seems to need a cause, and according to volitionalism, this fact-maker can only be the agent rather than the set of her existing beliefs and desires.
Third, once we allow motive-states that are inherently active or brought about by the agent in light of reasons, why limit this class to decisions and the intentions they form? For much of our action is guided via practical deliberation that depends on long-term goals, commitments, or cares that make up what Korsgaard calls our "practical identity." Perhaps the motives involved in these devotions are also actively formed by the agent, though not normally in any single act of decision, given their dispositional depth. This is what I call "projective motivation,"7 and it is a natural extension of Wallace's volitionalist model to motive-states that are vital for personal autonomy. For example, we already saw that Wallace must regard a desire to live well as a motive that is actively formed. This expansion of "volition" also allows us to explain why Williams is wrong to regard "ground projects" simply as desires with respect to which the agent is passive, or that trace ultimately to desires outside the agent's control. These questions relate directly to the main themes in Part II of Wallace's collection. But first we will consider some fascinating arguments that Wallace makes concerning the will and sources of normativity in the intervening chapters.
Chapters III – VI: Moral Theory and the Will
The next three chapters consist mainly of responses to Dancy and Korsgaard, who have developed accounts of rational agency that are close in important respects to Wallace's. In chapter III, Wallace argues that Dancy's version of the motivation requirement (which Dancy calls the "normative constraint") is too literal, leading him to hold that an agent's motivating reasons are sometimes identical with her normative reasons for an action (64). Dancy is right, Wallace thinks, to insist that normative reasons for a course of action rarely consist (solely) in psychological states of the agent; but this leads Dancy through his identity thesis to the counterintuitive conclusion that motivating reasons are also usually facts about the world outside the agent's psyche. It then becomes hard to explain cases where the agent's motivating reason is mistaken. Instead, Wallace suggests that we find an interpretation of the normative constraint that gives psychological states a role in reasons-explanations (65). He suggests that explanations citing motivating reasons are third-personal accounts of why an agent has performed a completed action (or is performing an ongoing one). By contrast, normative reasons are (usually) nonpsychological facts that can be considered in first-personal prospective deliberation about how to act (66). Although motivating and normative reasons are thus distinct, they are connected in that motives and beliefs cited in retrospective explanation should "render intelligible the agent's deliberative point of view," or make sense of the agent's actions, by explaining what normative reasons she considered in so acting (68).
Although I think Wallace is correct to insist on this distinction between these two kinds of reasons, I'm not quite sure his diagnosis of it is correct. For in citing the reasons that the agent took to justify her action, we may still think she was wrong: she did not latch onto reasons that are in fact normative for her circumstances. Thus accounts of normative reasons can also be third-personal: we not only deliberate first-personally about what we should do; we also frequently debate about whether others were justified in acting for the reasons they did. Hence it seems more natural to say that motivating reasons are just the considerations that the agent took to be normative, or that were putatively normative for her, or that she judged to be justifying (in cases where actual judgment occurs). So a motivating reason is the appearance of a normative reason
- its seeming to an agent, or an agent judging, that X is a normative reason. By contrast, a normative reason X itself is what actually justifies such a psychological state aimed at X as its intentional content. This account seems to do what Wallace wants without tying the distinction to the difference between first and third-personal points of view.
Chapters IV and V then defend a realist account of normative reasons against Korsgaard's constructivism. After canvassing several possible versions of moral realism, Wallace agrees with Korsgaard that on a plausible realist view, moral facts will not obtain unless they serve as reasons for action or speak to the first-personal deliberative viewpoint (74). "Normative moral realism" in this sense accepts that we do not always apply norms to our actions, but requires no reason why we are obligated to apply them that is distinct from the reasons for the norm itself (75-76). But he acknowledges Korsgaard's concern that "the independence of moral truths does not itself explain their normative grip on us" (76), or why we are obligated by them; he also gives a sympathetic explanation of Korsgaard's constructivism according to which "the normative principles that govern the will are the very same principles that are constitutive of the will in the first place" (77). But Wallace does not think that Korsgaard can explain the relevant concept of commitment to principles that are implicit in any act of will without presupposing a prior normative principle that is not "constructed" by the will's acts. Aside from the problem that there is too wide a variety of normative considerations to be grounded this way, if the inescapable implicit commitment is to "believe or accept that it would be good or valuable to comply with certain principles," then it is unclear why such beliefs must motivate; thus "commitment" remains ambiguous between cognitive and conative senses in Korsgaard (80).
In my view, this criticism is exactly right, but the heart of Korsgaard's account may be saved if we give up the attempt to keep it "constructivist" in any sense resembling voluntary or ideal contracts. Wallace is correct to read Korsgaard's position as a "transcendental" argument that the principle of instrumental reason and the categorical imperative cannot be denied or violated on pain of "performative contradiction" (80). In this respect, her account is similar to Jürgen Habermas's "discourse ethics." However, since the implicit commitment to the inviolable value of free rational willing (or self-governance through practical reasoning) is made in each and every act of decision
- whatever the content of the intention formed - it is independent of each particular act of will. Thus the source of normativity is really the self-affirming structure of the will as capable of motivating the agent in response to objective values. Of course one still has to make the difficult case that the will does implicitly affirm such a unique value, which requires expression in non-consequentialist loyalty to the inherent dignity of personhood, when its power is employed to form any intention whatsoever. But if such a case can be made, so that (for example) it involves a performative contradiction to sell oneself into slavery, or to intentionally destroy one's autonomy, then at least one type of norm (basic moral norms) will arise from a metaphysical fact about a reflexive evaluation that is always present in rational willing, whether acknowledged or not. It is open to realism to hold that no rational capacity could be so structured without in fact being correct about its own inviolable value, in which case this value is not merely constructed in the will's activity. This kind of transcendental value, which functions as a side-constraint on the pursuit of all other first-order goods, does not attract or incline us as in erosiac desire, but instead provides an ever-accessible ground for self-motivation. In other words, when we reinterpret the "commitment" in which normativity arises for Korsgaard as a state of projective motivation in my sense, the ambiguity Wallace finds in this concept is resolved. The moral agent has a standing reason present in the nature of her own volitional activity to commit herself to the inviolable dignity of persons: the motive of duty arises from volitional response to this objective value. The immoral agent always has the same grounds as the moral agent to form the same project (however much he might try to ignore or hide these grounds from view).
Perhaps agents cannot avoid implying their acceptance of this ground for the moral motive even if Korsgaard is wrong that each intention affirms a "law" or universal prescription regarding which "features of one's circumstances" are reason-giving (84). For the unavoidability of the moral implication may be explained in ways that do not build this especially strong type of "reason" into all intentions. Wallace rightly objects that this strong rationalist conception of intention obscures the line between "volitional commitment," by which he (like Korsgaard) means agent-guided intention-formation,8 and fully "endorsed" or autonomous intentional action (83). But I think we can maintain this distinction, allowing akratic (and even wanton and alienated) acts to count as intentional without denying that intentional action is always done for prior "reasons" in some sense (and that intentions are formed for these reasons that make sense of the intended actions).9 Here "make sense of" is weaker than "justify" and closer to "can be taken to count in favor of." Wallace seems to allow reasons in this weaker sense as "normatively structured thoughts" that are often involved in desires and emotions, though the agent does not accept them (86, and see 87, note 9). This is similar to what Robert Roberts has called the practical "construal" involved in affects.10 Korsgaard would doubtless respond that if I intend to act on the desire to burn my roommate's books for spite, then since the desire (or the value-construal involved in it) did not cause me to form this intention I must, to form it myself, accept the norm that it's okay to act on such desires (when they are strong enough
- or add further qualifications, as long as they don't narrow the possible cases in which the norm applies down to this single case). Wallace's rejoinder is that if this were correct, then I would be acting on my all-things-considered best judgment even when the construal involved in my desire is not accepted and is not identical with the judgment on which I act (88-89). This may show that to form an intention is more than "acceptance of a normative principle or judgment," but can't Korsgaard fall back on the idea that such a judgment is necessary though not sufficient for intention? Perhaps we can also have more than one all-things-considered best judgment?<!-[if !supportFootnotes]—> This looks to me like a standoff, but see also Wallace's analysis of addictive desires in chapter VIII for more on this issue.
Much of the rest of chapter V argues that practical and theoretical agency are less analogous than Korsgaard has held. Although practical reason is governed by aiming at the good, our choices and intentions do not necessarily follow such practical judgments in the way that beliefs naturally follow judgments about the truth (93-94). There follows an extended analysis of the principle of instrumental reason in which Wallace argues that it still applies when an akratic agent is "clever" about seeking ends to which she has made no normative commitment. After critiquing Broome's interpretation of the instrumental principle, Wallace offers his own account which depends on two more basic principles. First, an agent intending to X must believe that it is possible for her to X (105). Rational constraints arise from intentions because there are rational constraints on what we can believe it is possible for us to do. Second, rationality requires that intending to Z requires believing that one intends to Z and vice-versa. Thus intending to X, plus believing that Y-ing is necessary for X, requires believing that you intend to Y, which in turn requires intending to Y (107-8). My one objection to this analysis is the apparent possibility of what we might call 'hopeless action,' in which an agent sets out to pursue some goal G while believing that G unattainable. Perhaps in such cases we simply attribute an expressive end to them instead, such as making a statement or protest. But such agents may insist that trying to G is essential to their expressive act. It is important to note that Wallace has added an extended Postscript to this analysis (111-20) in which he addresses several other interesting objections to his strategy of tracing the instrumental principle to "requirements of theoretical rationality" (112).
Chapter VI develops Wallace's account of moral responsibility in terms of the rational powers that have to be in place for us to hold people accountable for their acts and intentions. This third-personal perspective contrasts with the first-personal perspective of rational deliberation, which itself splits into moral and eudaimonistic standpoints (130). Here Wallace takes seriously Bernard Williams's contention that "the sentimental bases of ethical concern are plural, contingent, and socially and historically conditioned" (127). Williams and Frankfurt have both argued that "morality" in its narrow deontological sense may not be what we care about most in our personal lives, and Wallace construes this personal perspective as "eudaimonist" in a weak sense: it concerns "living well, where living well is in turn a matter of having a variety of ends worth caring about" (132). There is already a problem here: if one does not aim at final ends involved in one's personal projects at least in part because the achievement (or pursuit) of them constitutes some part of one's own happiness of flourishing (132, note 21), then "eudaimonism" is emptied of all its substantive implications. For example, a utilitarian could say that I "live well" precisely when I give absolute priority to the goal of maximizing average happiness for all sentient beings, which might require entirely giving up my other personal projects, or even my life. Yet Wallace wishes to deny that we can simply "define the good life in moral terms" (131).
This weak sense of eudaimonism makes it easier for Wallace to argue that there is potential agreement between the two deliberative standpoints, i.e., that one "has most reason to comply with moral demands (the optimality thesis… )" (130). This label is also unfortunate because Wallace does not mean that abiding by moral norms is optimal in the sense of maximizing nonmoral good(s) involved in individual well-being (131). Since neither standpoint can simply be reduced to the other, the best we can hope for is that they "converge," which they do if "our own life goes best as a whole when the pursuit of our nonmoral ends is made conditional on our compliance with the demands of morality" (132). But since there seems to be no independent standard here for lives "going best as a whole," I'm not sure how giving overriding significance to moral demands could turn out to make our lives eudaimon unless giving trumping status to moral norms is smuggled into the conception of "living best." This seems to be exactly what Wallace does in the next section (133-37). If we take "moral principles as fixed constraints within which our personal projects and activities are to proceed," then we have adopted a Kantian attitude towards our practical identities rather than a eudaimonist one. I agree with this attitude, but how does Wallace answer Williams's objection that Gauguin may be rational in going off to Tahiti to pursue his art while leaving the family destitute at home? Williams's imagined Gauguin is not an amoralist, nor someone who sees moral norms as having only instrumental value (135). Wallace's answer seems to be that as "deeply social creatures," it is essential to our living well (and why not add, to our "happiness"?), that we can justify our actions to others "by reference to common moral principles" that we all accept in reciprocally holding each other accountable (136). But Williams can respond that in fact Gauguin should be able to justify his actions to others as based on personal imperatives
- at least those who have experienced strong creative passions will understand. This would show that rational justification does not require treating moral principles as side-constraints. Wallace appears to concede the possibility of this kind of conflict and hence to let Gauguin count as less than fully responsible for moral wrongdoing (138-40). Many people will feel unsatisfied with this result and hold that agents normally do have the motive-power to subordinate their "personal relationships and commitments" to morality when these imperatives conflict (140). Wallace is willing to reject direct utilitarianism because it would make such conflict ubiquitous in our lives; but then why not reject Kantian norms as also very likely to cause a "fundamental breakdown in the integrative project of eudaimonistic reflection" (141)? One promising answer is Korsgaard's argument that the normative status that our practical identities have for us presupposes implicit recognition of the overriding value of agents capable of forming practical identities and conforming them to the moral law.
Moreover, it seems to me that Wallace's account is subject to a version of Plato's Gyges objection: what if I have the power to reliably appear justified to others according to common moral standards, while actually violating moral norms with total impunity? On his account, would a motive to appear this way be enough to reconcile my being held morally responsible with my putting my own interests ahead of all others in my practical deliberation? Or, to put it another way, what is to stop Gyges from regarding this strategy as the best way to live, if it can succeed? Finally, suppose that a standing policy of subordinating personal projects to moral obligations (perhaps within some limits) is essential to our life going well. Still, it seems that this benefit to the agent of giving morality such a strong (if not absolutely overriding) role is a byproduct rather than the reason on which the agent acts in intending to keep her actions within moral limits. So it is not entirely clear what motivational work the integration between morality and eudaimonia can do.<!-[if !supportFootnotes]—>12
Chapter VII: Free Will and Moral Responsibility
This chapter, along with the next two, are especially important in the collection because they develop Wallace's earlier account of moral responsibility. He writes, "To set the record straight: I take the emphasis on the capacity to rise above one's given desires to be an appealing feature of libertarian and agent-causation theories" (174, n.14), even though he describes this capacity differently. "Volitional motivations," of which the main examples are choices and decisions, "are independent from our given desires" in the sense that which intention is formed is not "a function of the given desires to which the agent is subject at the time" (150). This follows from the fact that we have desires that encourage actions not in accord with our best practical judgment; our capacity for rational guidance of our actions thus implies an ability to generate new motivation beyond the sum of existing desires in forming intentions (150-51). This argument might usefully be compared to Susan Wolf's "Reason View," which holds that responsible agents who act immorally could have done otherwise
- in particular, they could have conformed their actions to the requirements of practical reason.<!-[if !supportFootnotes]—>13 Wallace's account is incompatible with "psychological determinism" defined as the view that our beliefs and desires causally determine our intentions and actions (146). Conditionalist analyses of freedom do not capture the "distinctive kind of capacity that seems to be required for moral agency" (152). Presumably Wallace would have to say the same about the sort of dispositions to reasons-responsiveness cited as providing sufficient control for moral responsibility by semi-compatibilists - though he does not address this question in the book, and though he was sympathetic with actual-sequence accounts of responsibility-relevant control in his earlier work.<!-[if !supportFootnotes]—>14 It no longer seems so clear that rational self-control in the actual sequence leading to intention and action is "completely independent from questions about the alternate possibilities that may have been open to one…"15
But Wallace still wants to distinguish his "volitionalist" account of willing from "agent-causation" views according to which agents are direct and irreducible causes of "some events that cannot be explained in scientific terms" (147), perhaps such as "the firing of neurons in a person's brain" (152). The problem with agent-causal models is their underlying assumption that the right metaphysical account of choice is part of "an explanatory theory of the world" on a par with scientific explanation (153). Wallace rejects the idea that accounts of moral freedom need to serve such a primarily theoretical goal. Instead, the point of postulating distinctively volitional powers (beyond belief-desire combinations) is not to explain and predict action, but rather to support our first-personal view of ourselves as agents who can guide our actions by practical deliberation, even when our stronger desires oppose the deliverances of practical reason. This approach asserts "the autonomy of practical reason and the legitimacy of the entities postulated for purposes of practical deliberation" (145)
- or, in more transcendental terms, entities and powers that ground the possibility of guiding intentions by practical reasoning. Wallace rightly attributes this view to Korsgaard, but he is more clearly willing to regard the practical account of choice as having genuine "ontological commitments" (148) rather than as merely a standpoint that we necessarily inhabit, whose psychological inescapability implies no metaphysical claims that could conflict with any results of the theoretical point of view. For he recognizes that implications of the practical/deliberative standpoint of agency must at least be compatible with the deliverances of the natural sciences (148), and presumably with other indisputable deliverances of metaphysics (if there are any). Thus freedom in the first-personal perspective of agency cannot be entirely "insulated" from theoretical reason: it has "explanatory implications even if it is not itself directed to the resolution of explanatory questions" (160). I suggest that we think of these as metaphysical underpinnings of the practical point of view.
In particular, these theoretical implications do conflict with psychological determinism of the sort we see in "hydraulic" models according to which we always act on our strongest desire, but Wallace insists that they do not conflict with determinism at the purely physical level. If we are precise about "the theoretical commitments raised by the standpoint of practical reason" (161), we realize that it is only our passivity in relation to given desires that conflicts with the freedom we need to be able to guide our intentions in light of norms (162). Physical states of our brain and body are not themselves motivational states, and thus physical determinism does not directly threaten our "power to comply with norms" (163). Determinism at the microphysical level is "too remote from the deliberative categories of power, competence, temptation, choice, intentional action" etc. to pose a problem for this way of understanding ourselves in action (163).
Thus Wallace arrives at a new version of semi-compatibilism according to which moral freedom is compatible with physical determinism but not compatible with psychological determinism. This view is distinct from Daniel Dennett's position that the deliberative perspective only requires sufficiently rich epistemic possibilities, not physical possibilities. For Wallace's semi-compatibilism, as I understand it, requires a real psychological power to intend otherwise than our current set of desires would dictate, which suggests both that our intentions are not just caused by our total belief-desire state at the time of intention-formation, and also that we can set new final ends in recognition of reasons for pursuing these ends that do not themselves constitute passive desires of ours. This power to transcend our prepurposive motives I called "projective motivation," and it seems to be another important type of "volition" in Wallace's sense, in addition to intention and decision.<!-[if !supportFootnotes]—>16
Wallace is surely correct that such volitional powers do not directly entail (in any obvious way) the falsity of physical determinism, especially at the microphysical level. It may be easier to understand this point in its contrapositive form: that our intentions, choices, and final ends are all physically determined by micro-level processes does not (obviously) entail that they are determined through our strongest desires or prepurposive motives; for example, they might instead be determined through normative judgments, or through projective response to such judgments. Some of Wallace's language concerning "distance" between brain-states and psychological states could suggest that he is leaving room for emergent psychological properties not determined at the micro-physical level, but I do not think that this is what he means, or that his volitionalism requires such emergentism. Suppose that my set of normative thoughts at time T1 supervene on brain-states B1, and my intention formed at T2 supervenes on some brain-states B2 in which the intention is realized. B1 together with the rest of the past and laws may nomologically necessitate B2, and Wallace will say this is consistent with his volitionalism: for the guidance-relation between my normative thoughts at T1 and my intention at T2 may be a logical relation between their contents.
However, this is not as obvious as Wallace suggests in his brief treatment of this hard issue. For his account, like Wolf's, implies that agents who are responsible for akrasia or wrongdoing could have guided their intentions according to reasons for better actions in more than a merely dispositional sense (e.g., that there are some nearby possible worlds in which the same psychological processes operate and the agent makes a better choice17). Wallace's conception of normative guidance apparently supports a version of ought-implies-can that is robust enough to entail leeway-liberty in these cases. But if microphysical determinism is true and there are no emergent properties at the psychological level, then these agents could not have intended or acted otherwise (or specifically, acted as practical reason indicated). Suppose that this inability is not due to their being ruled by their strongest desires; instead, it traces to physical states not associated with these desires. The desires could be overcome, and yet these agents could not conform their intentions to their properly formed best practical judgments. This suggests that the falsity of the strongest desire thesis is not enough for the moral freedom involved in Wallace's volitionalism.
The status of the metaphysical or "explanatory" beliefs internal to the deliberative point of view also remains somewhat unclear. Some of Wallace's descriptions suggest that the metaphysical demands of practical reasoning are purely internal to the first-personal standpoint of agency. Thus "the power of choice is not understood as a causal force in competition with other forms of causality" in the order of nature (154). Rather, "the notions of causation, power, and bringing about are supplied with a first-personal deliberative interpretation" and in this form, they do no retrospective explanatory work (157). Or to the extent that our talk of decision and intention has explanatory import, "The network of concepts to which agency belongs is explanatory in relation to these essentially deliberative phenomena" (158). But such a purely practical sense of metaphysical claims implies that practical freedom could coexist with theoretical commitment to psychological determinism, as long as psychological determinism is false within our 'practical metaphysics.' Wallace clearly does not accept this kind of separation of metaphysical discourses. But if we give up this sharp separation with its counterintuitive implications, then the idea of the "independence" of the practical standpoint is not strong enough by itself to block the transfer of non-responsibility from laws and physical states in the remote past to our current psychological states. Once it is admitted that these two standpoints must at least be consistent with each other, even if results can be derived in one that cannot be derived in the other (given their different starting points), then Wallace's semi-compatibilism appears to be unstable. He needs to offer a new version of his 1996 argument that the control required for moral responsibility consists in general rational powers rather than in the physical possibility of exercising this or that rational ability on a given occasion.
Chapters VIII – IX: Desires and Autonomy
The next chapter presents a novel account of additive desires, but I will focus only on points that are relevant for Wallace's account of autonomy in chapter IX. Wallace challenges the idea that action on addictive desires is simply involuntary (165), and compares their resilience to that of natural bodily appetites that can be "unresponsive to the agent's own deliberative reflection" (170). Addictive impulses are "volitional defects" because an agent subject to them may still be able to reason well about what he should do, but have great difficulty in conforming his intentions to his judgments (171). Hydraulic models have trouble distinguishing addictions and compulsive disorders from mere akrasia, because according to the strongest desire thesis, the akratic agent could not have resisted acting on his desire given his current set of motives at the time of action (173). Mele and others have offered compatibilist answers to this problem suggesting that akratic agents would have done otherwise if they had refocused their attention or issued commands to themselves or engaged in other strategies to manipulate their desires, whereas agents under the grip of compulsive disorders would not (174), or would require more extraordinary techniques (175). Aside from the problem that initiating strategies of self-control must itself be determined by "further forces operative within the agent's psychological economy" on the hydraulic model (176), this picture of self-control "leaves no real room for genuine deliberative agency." For self-control to include our ordinary understanding of self-guidance by normative consideration, Wallace thinks we need to understand desires in general as more than brute forces: they have "quasi-perceptual" intentional content, such as anticipated sensations or pictures of a possible future state as pleasant or good in some way (180). Using Roberts' term again, these are "construals" rather than judgments that the agent actually makes or assents to. Thus they can conflict with our actual normative judgments, yet imagine a "prospective action or experience" under "an evaluative category" (181).
This moderately cognitivist account of desires is highly plausible and squares well with recent work on emotions (by Roberts, Wollheim, and others); it also helps explain, as Wallace emphasizes, how practical deliberation can connect with the intentional content of desires rather than merely combating them as opposing forces. However, it would help Wallace's account to emphasize that the construal of value in the object of many desires is purely subjective, in the sense that it cannot be distinguished from the attraction it exerts on the agent. Such desires have more content than a pure drive or dystopic irritation (179), yet they involve no judgment or even construal of objective value in the object independent from its prospective effects on the desiring agent. This contrasts with "being attracted to a course of action precisely because one judges that it would be good to perform" (177, n.19), say because it will enhance one's well-being, or because it is noble. We might compare this to Charles Taylor's well-known (though not uncontroversial) distinction between "weak" and "strong" evaluation.18 Wallace acknowledges that this latter kind of motive is more active, since judgment is something we perform, and desires following from such objective-value judgments are crucial in his account of autonomy in the next chapter.
Chapter IX is one of the most interesting in the collection, containing insights on some of the most heavily debated topics in recent moral psychology. I will focus my comments on Wallace's critique of Harry Frankfurt's hierarchical model of autonomy and his own alternative, leaving aside most of his impressive response to Frankfurt's subjectivist account of caring (with which I largely agree). In his critique of Frankfurt's initial hierarchical model, Wallace follows Wolf and the early Gary Watson in arguing that "the attitudes definitive of the real self are evaluative judgments" (191). He begins by arguing that, while practical deliberation involves reflexivity, Frankfurt erred in thinking that autonomy results from second-order states that explicitly focus on one's having a certain first-order desire, or acting on it, as episodes in one's psychology. He thinks this is because Frankfurt has a noncognitive conception of desires as pure preferences or "pro-attitudes;" thus second-order volitions abstract from the "content" of our first-order desires, "focusing instead on the brute psychological fact of our being inclined one way or the other…" (195).
It is important to be clear about what this means, though. Frankfurt refers to "the capacity for reflective self-evaluation that is manifested in the formation of second-order desires" as a distinguishing mark of persons,19 but he never says that second-order desires are essential to practical reflection. Indeed, he says that a wanton "may possess and employ rational faculties of a higher order," and engage at least in instrumental deliberation.20 Moreover, Frankfurt's examples often suggest that the higher-order volition to act on a desire D1 concerns the content or intentional object of D1, rather than just the fact of being moved by D1: the man who wants to act on his professional desire to finish his work21 presumably identifies with this professional motive because he thinks its object is important (whether or not this in turn rests on an objective value-judgment). What Wallace means, I think, is that according to Frankfurt, when I identify with the desire to go to a film tonight rather than to go to the theater, I'm simply endorsing the brute preference for film over theater: the first-order desire has an object, but its objective value (or lack thereof) is not what Frankfurtian second-order volitions aim at. In other words, second-order volitions only involve simple weighing of first-order desires.22 I think this is a clearer way to put Wallace's point.
This also helps explain his criticism that Frankfurt's account does not "do justice to the outward focus" of practical deliberation, in which we attend to the substantive merits of different kinds of (nonvolitional) activities or goals (193). If we only consider the brute attractiveness of first-order goals or the strength of our inclinations to them, it is not even clear how second-order desires could identify with weaker first-order desires or less brute-appealing goals. The "outward focus" that Wallace requires for autonomy involves strong evaluation of first-order options, not merely endorsement of a desire because its object has a lot of attractive pull. But higher-order desires cannot settle the main deliberative question concerning whether the object of a given first-order motive is really worth pursuing, all things considered. Wallace rightly emphasizes this lack of rational authority in second-order desires even if we are "satisfied" with them in Frankfurt's negative sense and thus do not need to endorse them in third-order attitudes (194). We might restate his point as follows: it is possible for second-order volitions to be akratic (or even for our passive satisfaction with them to be akratic), yet Frankfurt's account cannot explain this. This is why Stump has altered the definition of higher-order volitions to include strong evaluative judgments. Wallace also analyzes identification with a first-order desire to see a movie as reaching a "positive verdict" that it "really would be good to do" what this desire suggests doing (196-97). But he should be clearer that this kind of judgment must appeal to something more than relative attractiveness, i.e. to some set of strongly contrastive standards that we can autonomously take as objective23 (which in turn presumably requires that they are not the result of systematic deception or manipulation).
Even with this clarification, though, there are two important problems with Wallace's proposal, which he calls the "substantive model" of autonomy. First, like all rationalist models, it seems to ignore the need for the agent to commit herself to the goals or ways of living indicated by the relevant ethical judgments. Wallace does a good job responding to Frankfurt's own arguments that evaluative judgments about roles and relationships may not be sufficient for caring about them; for example, he points out that relevant evaluative judgments normally take the agent's interests and personality into account (198-99)
- and we might add their individuating history as well.<!-[if !supportFootnotes]—>24 He also makes an interesting case that in the right normative circumstances, it is possible to identify with a career or course of study that one does not find greatly enjoyable:
If I diligently apply myself to the subject despite my lack of enthusiasm, in the conviction that doing so is the best course open to me under the circumstances, I would thereby seem to demonstrate that I care about doing well in it… (200)
But note how the agent described here has moved beyond making the relevant highly particular value-judgment to embracing it in decision and dedicating himself to the indicated ends. Unless we think that such evaluations not only must