Normativity: Epistemic and Practical

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Conor McHugh, Jonathan Way, and Daniel Whiting (eds.), Normativity: Epistemic and Practical, Oxford University Press, 2018, 272pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198758709.

Reviewed by Mark Schroeder, University of Southern California


It is the stated purpose of this volume to "examine the norms which concern us as agents alongside the norms which concern us as inquirers . . . to explore substantive and explanatory connections between practical and epistemic norms, to consider whether these norms are at some level unified, and to ask what that might mean".[1] As the editors note in their introduction, by tradition philosophical inquiry into the norms governing action and belief have been parceled into the silos of ethics and epistemology, respectively. The present volume is part of an effort to support and bring together philosophers who are part of a growing recognition that the traditional division of labor between ethics and epistemology is something to be overcome, and should be applauded as such, in addition to its many substantive contributions.

Full disclosure: the present author has been an avid proponent of considering the questions of ethics and epistemology side by side for two decades and is the most-cited author in the volume. In this review I'll focus most on trying to say something both constructive and critical about the organizing principle of the volume, while trying along the way to say something brief about each of the included papers and where I see them fitting into that scheme. It should go without saying that each paper deserves much more attention than the handful of sentences that I will be able to give it in passing in a review of this nature.

The most obvious way in which we might expect the division of labor between ethics and epistemology to distort comes from not considering their questions in parallel. For example, both actions and beliefs can be rational, but when we ask about the conditions under which an action is rational we call that 'ethics', and when we ask about the conditions under which a belief is rational, we call that 'epistemology'. Yet surely if both actions and beliefs can be rational, the correct theory of when actions are rational should be decomposable into a theory of rationality and an account of what makes actions particularly special inputs into that theory. And similar points go for the theory of rational belief. To conclude otherwise seems like the kind of thing that should require an argument, not just waking up one morning and realizing that your account of what S has reason to believe cannot apply to actions, because actions cannot be true or false, and your account only applies to things that can be true or false, because those are the only examples that you thought about while you were theorizing.

So a volume of work exploring the deep connections between ethics and epistemology is very much welcome. Yet for the most part, the essays in this volume do not consider what unity there might be between ethics and epistemology, but rather a variety of proposed substantive and explanatory connections between norms on action and norms on belief. So let's survey these connections in order to see how they compare to the overall ways in which epistemology and ethics might suffer by not being pursued in tandem.

A leading example of a substantive connection in the editors' conception of the volume is the thesis of pragmatic encroachment in epistemology, according to which what someone knows can depend on what she should do. Matthew McGrath's chapter defends this thesis by seeking to argue that one class of its problems are shared by other views about reasons and emotions that are much harder to deny. Its thesis, though unsurprising in retrospect given the close relationships others have argued for between knowledge, acting for reasons, and factive emotions, is developed with the care that it deserves and is characteristic of McGrath's work.

Meanwhile, Charity Anderson's and Baron Reed's chapters oppose pragmatic encroachment. Anderson's goal is to undermine a style of argument for pragmatic encroachment pursued by Jeremy Fantl and Matthew McGrath in their book [2009], grounded in a purported tension between fallibilism about knowledge, the denial of pragmatic encroachment, and a third thesis defended by Fantl and McGrath. Anderson argues plausibly both that the tension can be escaped and that the third principle should be rejected in any case. It is a promising and forceful response to one of the most prominent arguments for pragmatic encroachment, though my own view as a proponent of pragmatic encroachment is that this is not how it is best motivated.[2]

Reed's practice-based account of the importance of knowledge is one of the more interesting developments in the volume, as he begins to develop a general picture that can be applied to norms governing action as well as those governing belief, and it is worth thinking seriously about. But the force of what I take to be his most novel criticism of pragmatic encroachment -- that it allows for a phenomenon he calls practical persuasion, which allows us to cite facts about stakes in order to rationally talk someone out of some view -- depends very much, I think, on what it means for a proposition to be 'high stakes'. In particular, the examples that he uses to push this problem, though intuitively forceful, are not consequences of my own way of thinking about stakes, according to which the effects of stakes come from high costs of error -- a feature that is absent in his intuitively forceful examples. And I am cautiously doubtful whether their intuitive force transfers to other cases.

The editors' leading example of a substantive connection between ethics and epistemology running in the reverse direction is the thesis of epistemic perspectivism about the deliberative 'ought'. Benjamin Kiesewetter defends such a view in his chapter. According to this view, what you ought to do depends on the agent's perspective, because it depends on what she is in a position to know. So on this view, the correct norms on action depend on the answers to questions from epistemology.

Kiesewetter's arguments are I think a particularly forceful development of the problems in explaining how 'ought' judgments could be practical on the most obvious, most objective version of the alternative, agent-insensitive view. And more importantly, it offers a particularly clear-headed picture of why the agent-sensitive view is not committed to many of the more extreme claims that have tended to make people, including past versions of myself, doubt that it could be true. But Kiesewetter's arguments ultimately fail, I think, because they do not take seriously enough the possibility that the view that he rejects could also take a less extreme form. Indeed, building on work by Niko Kolodny and Andrew Sepielli, I have recently argued that it does -- for objective 'ought' judgments (the ones that do not depend on what the agent is in a position to know) -- may instead be sensitive to what the speaker is in a position to know.[3] This view makes them particularly well-suited to play both roles in deliberation, because in first-personal deliberation the speaker and the agent are the same. Hence, it allows us to resist Kiesewetter's objections to the most extreme version of the view, just as his view resists the objections to the most extreme version of the alternative.

Now, although I am personally deeply invested in whether there is pragmatic encroachment in epistemology (yes) and whether the deliberative 'ought' is epistemically perspectival in this particular way (no), it is worth observing that these substantive connections between ethics and epistemology are in a certain sense fairly shallow, on the scale of evidence that it is a mistake of some significance to pursue ethics and epistemology in isolation from one another. After all, if there is pragmatic encroachment on knowledge, then it turns out that some considerations that the epistemological orthodoxy of most of the twentieth century would have classified as 'pragmatic' or 'practical' can matter for the epistemic norms governing beliefs. But it doesn't follow -- or at least, not immediately -- that epistemologists have much to learn from ethicists about these matters.

Epistemologists may have much to learn about the possibility or consequences of pragmatic encroachment by the instructive comparison with ethics -- indeed, I have been at pains to argue this at length in much of my work over the last ten years[4] -- but learning that there is pragmatic encroachment on knowledge does not itself settle whether ethicists will have anything interesting to say about what form that encroachment might take. Contrast the possibility that there is, in addition, moral encroachment on knowledge -- the thesis that some things cannot be known, at least given the available evidence, because to believe them with no better evidence would be to wrong someone.[5] If moral encroachment is true, then epistemologists do have something important to learn from moral philosophers, in order to get their epistemology right.[6]

Similarly, suppose that Kiesewetter's form of epistemic perspectivalism is correct, and what agents ought to do in the deliberative sense of 'ought', depends on what they are in a position to know. Still, ethicists may have little to learn from epistemologists, because it could very well be that the most prominent disagreements among epistemologists leave by and large intact theoretically naïve judgments about in which cases agents know. Or it could turn out that though epistemologists differ sharply over whether some cases count as cases of knowledge -- for example, about whether fake barn country cases are genuine cases of knowledge or not -- there are tried and true strategies for explaining away intuitively differing judgments about such cases, which can be straightforwardly transferred to the contrasting ethical verdicts that these views might lead to, given epistemic perspectivalism.

The editors also classify a number of explanatory relationships between norms on action and norms on belief with which the essays concern themselves. The paradigm for an explanatory connection on which norms on belief are to be explained in terms of norms on action is the idea that the norms on belief can be accounted for in instrumental terms, as facilitating the goal of having true beliefs and avoiding error. Asbørn Steglich-Petersen defends such an account in his chapter. Or as Kate Nolfi argues in her chapter, contested by Jessica Brown's chapter, the purpose of belief might be to guide action, and so the appropriate norms on belief might be derivable from what would ground appropriate action.

Steglich-Petersen's goal in his paper is to answer a pair of objections to an instrumental account of epistemic norms that happen to have been named by me: the too few reasons objection, and the too many reasons objection.[7] Steglich-Petersen credits the names for these objections to Côté-Bouchard [2015], apparently not noticing that Côté-Bouchard explicitly attributes the names to me when he introduces them or noticing that they come from a book he himself cites and tries to criticize, though he both gets its title wrong and attributes it to another 'Schroeder', Timothy.

In considering whether evidence is required in order to justify belief, Nolfi argues that the way to explore whether this is so is to look at how belief is "ideally regulated", which depends on its broader function within our psychologies.[8] The things that justify belief (or make it unjustified, presumably), will be things that serve the right role in this broader system. Nolfi argues that we can use an understanding of belief on which its psychological role is to serve as a kind of 'map for action' in order to support a fairly weak version of this thesis. I am super-sympathetic to almost everything that she says here, but worry that we should want a somewhat stronger version of the thesis than she gives us.

Jessica Brown, in contrast, pushes back against the 'map for action' conception of belief. She considers and argues against two very different 'pragmatic approaches' to belief -- ones on which whether one believes is directly determined by practical features of one's circumstances or one's expectations of those features, and ones on which belief is instead a substantive state involving dispositions whose helpfulness varies depending on the practical features of one's circumstances. Jake Ross and I [2014] are the main target of her second class of criticisms, in section 6 of her paper, and our view is motivated in large part by very similar criticisms to those she gives of the other pragmatic approaches to belief. There are two main arguments that she gives against us, though. The first is I think unfair, turning on assumptions about dispositions that I would argue are problematic for any account of dispositions that accepts them. But the second -- that Ross's and my account of belief fails to provide a good enough account of why a belief is correct only if it is true -- I take to be a quite serious problem for the Reasoning Disposition view of belief as described by us in our paper. In order to confront this problem, Ross and I should not say that belief is just a state of being disposed, but rather that it is a state with a particular functional role which grounds the associated dispositions.

The reverse explanatory strategy, of course, is to hold that practical norms might be explained in terms of norms on belief, as is held by the thesis known as cognitivism about instrumental rationality, according to which the rational norm of means-end coherence governing intention can be derived from the rational norm of consistency governing belief. Errol Lord criticizes this view in his insightful chapter, contesting not the claim that if you violate the means-end norm of instrumental rationality, then you also violate some epistemic norm governing belief, but the idea that this can explain the norms governing intention, rather than counting as explaining them away.

This leaves five more chapters that fit in less well with the editor's classification of papers as contributing to substantive or explanatory connections between ethics and epistemology. But most of them are I think actually better examples of the fruits -- or at least point us toward the potential fruits -- of pursuing ethics and epistemology side by side. Daniel Star, for example, considers the question of the nature of reasons, contrasting his own view, that reasons are evidence of what you ought to do, with one advocated by Jonathan Way and a number of others, according to which reasons are the premises of good reasoning. These two theses bear a close relationship even though they are competitors -- for example, one of the most important responses that Kearns and Star give to proposed counterexamples to their treatment of reasons as evidence is to argue from a supposed connection between reasons and good reasoning to the rejection of the counterexamples. So it is particularly helpful to get Star's take, in particular, on this comparison.

Clayton Littlejohn's contribution illustrates the fruitfulness of the interchange between ethics and epistemology even more directly. Littlejohn seeks to argue against the thesis in epistemology that justification requires reasons or evidence, but he does so by drawing extensively on an analogy between justification in epistemology and justification in ethics. So though I disagree with what he says in nearly every paragraph, it is perhaps the best example in the volume of the fruits of doing ethics and epistemology in tandem. Reisner's chapter, in contrast, though it is framed in terms of the distinction between practical and epistemic domains, is so abstract that so far as I can see it could very well have been framed instead in terms of the distinction between moral and prudential domains, or the moral and the aesthetic.

My favorite contributions, however, are those from Ulrike Heuer and David Hunter. Heuer takes up the question of whether there is an interesting sense in which there are 'right' and 'wrong' kinds of reasons for different attitudes in any uniform sense. Noting correctly that the terminology of the 'wrong kind of reasons' has its original home in the context of what is required to defend fitting attitudes accounts of value, Heuer points out that what was at stake in this debate is at best only tangentially related to a way in which these terms have become coopted by Pamela Hieronymi, myself, and many others -- a way which presupposes that there is something in common between the distinction between epistemic and Pascalian reasons for belief, and other distinctions that we might make between normal and toxin puzzle reasons for intention, normal reasons for admiration and those provided by someone's mother offering you money to admire them, and so on.

My own view is that it is not just true, but particularly important that there is something in common across these cases, because that is one of the chief fruits of pursuing ethics and epistemology in company -- for we can use this fact in order to get leverage, as Nolfi does in her chapter, on the correct distinction between epistemic and non-epistemic reasons, and this can help us both to understand the right form of pragmatic encroachment in epistemology and to solve many other problems. So Heuer's arguments are a worthy and important challenge to this pillar of my own conception of the relationship between ethics and epistemology.

Finally, Hunter's chapter is both refreshing and important. It is hard, in philosophy, to notice something that is both entirely new to philosophers' attention and so close to the surface that one's uncle will almost certainly have something to say about it over the holidays. Yet that is what Hunter does, in the question that he sets himself in his article. Most people who claim that epistemology is a normative discipline are concerned with what people ought to or are permitted or are rational or have a reason to believe, and what knowledge entails about any of these normative claims. Hunter, in contrast, asks us to consider what someone ought to know or ought to have known. Claims of this kind -- and the relative difficulties in understanding them between knowledge-first and other approaches in epistemology -- deserve much more attention. I therefore hope that Hunter's chapter and the questions it poses receive the attention that they deserve.


Basu, Rima [2018]. Beliefs That Wrong. PhD dissertation, University of Southern California.

Côté-Bouchard [2015]. 'Epistemic Instrumentalism and the Too Few Reasons Objection.' International Journal of Philosophical Studies 23(3): 337-355.

Fantl, Jeremy, and Matthew McGrath [2009]. Knowledge in an Uncertain World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Kolodny, Niko, and John McFarlane [2010]. 'Ifs and Oughts.' The Journal of Philosophy 107(3): 115-143.

Ross, Jacob, and Mark Schroeder [2014]. 'Belief, Credence, and Pragmatic Encroachment.' Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 88(2): 259-288.

Schroeder, Mark [2007]. Slaves of the Passions. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

______ [2010]. 'Value and the Right Kind of Reasons.' Oxford Studies in Metaethics 5: 25-55.

______ [2012a]. 'Stakes, Withholding, and Pragmatic Encroachment on Knowledge.' Philosophical Studies 160(2): 265-285.

______ [2012b]. 'The Ubiquity of State-Given Reasons.' Ethics 122(3): 457-488.

______ [2013]. 'State-Given Reasons: Prevalent, if not Ubiquitous.' Ethics 124(1): 128-140.

______ [2015a]. 'Knowledge is Belief for Sufficient (Objective and Subjective) Reason.' Oxford Studies in Epistemology, volume 5, 226-252.

______ [2015b]. 'What Makes Reasons Sufficient?' American Philosophical Quarterly 52(2): 159-170.

______ [2018a]. 'Getting Perspective on Objective Reasons.' Ethics 128(2): 289-319.

______ [2018b]. 'When Beliefs Wrong.' Philosophical Topics 46(1): 115-127.

______ [2018c]. 'Rational Stability under Pragmatic Encroachment.' Forthcoming in Episteme.

Sepielli, Andrew [2012]. 'Subjective Normativity and Action Guidance.' Oxford Studies in Normative Ethics 2: 45-73.

[1] McHugh, Way, and Whiting, ‘Introduction’, 2.

[2] Schroeder [2018c]

[3] Schroeder [2018a], Kolodny and MacFarlane [2010], Sepielli [2012].

[4] Schroeder [2012a], [2012b], [2013], [2015], [2018b], [2018c], Ross and Schroeder [2014],

[5] Compare especially Basu [2018]. 

[6] Schroeder [2018b].

[7] Schroeder [2007].

[8] Compare Schroeder [2010], [2012b], [2013].