Normativity, Meaning, and the Promise of Phenomenology

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Matthew Burch, Jack Marsh, and Irene McMullin (eds.), Normativity, Meaning, and the Promise of Phenomenology, Routledge, 2019, 357pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138479913.

Reviewed by Michael K. Shim, California State University-Los Angeles


The object in front of you consists of particles arranged stack-of-cash-wise. As far as the fundamental stuff of nature goes, this stack of cash is no different than the Maltese Falcon it will trade for or the Walther semi-automatic lying beside it. Since the Enlightenment, most of us have become accustomed to endorsing this kind of bald naturalism -- if for nothing else than deference to the scientific enterprise. That the object should be money hard-won through coercive use of the Walther, that the statuette next to it turns out to be counterfeit, all seem either beside the point or, at best, explicable as the functions of some more bosons and muons, this time arranged into status-conscious primates. Nevertheless, no matter how earnestly we may wish to embrace some physics-inspired Stoicism, our simian attitudes, emotions, moods and actions, collude with anonymous values, institutional obligations, arbitrary social rules, and other such artefactual means and ends into which we've all been thrown, to constitute what the phenomenological tradition calls world. Though this world may indeed supervene on the infinite field of particles and waves of nature, it is nevertheless where we dwell, care, tell each other what to do and why, and discover (or invent) meaning to our existence. This collection of essays, edited by Matthew Burch, Jack Marsh, and Irene McMullin, is  "above all concerned with the normative structure of meaning and the existential conditions that make it possible," an interpretation of the phenomenological project that "has been most consistently and compellingly advanced by Steven Crowell" (p. 1).

The volume is organized into five sections. Section I provides an overview of the key concepts, "meaning" and "normativity," as well as a delineation of what phenomenology can contribute to these issues. In Section II, we are offered phenomenological accounts of practical normativity. Then, in Section III, the authors attempt to square the apparent meaningfulness of our existence with the fact that we are, nonetheless, also merely more animals roaming the natural universe. Section IV is concerned with how seemingly reactive creatures of nature might pretend to spontaneous agency, as required by the norms of our ethics. Finally, in Section V, the contributors discuss the relevance of phenomenology to epistemic and perceptual norms. The volume concludes with a response by Crowell.

Section I opens with Sara Heinämaa's observation that the concept of normativity in the phenomenological discussion is "ambiguous." Invoking von Wright's taxonomy from outside the phenomenological tradition, she lays out three distinct -- albeit interrelated -- basic senses: constitutive, prescriptive and technical; upon which rest three further derivative senses: social, moral and ideal (pp. 12-13). To overcome this polysemous fuzziness in favor of greater conceptual specificity, Heinämaa ultimately recommends concepts more autochthonous to the phenomenological tradition, such as "'horizontality,' 'verticality,' 'teleology,' 'affectivity,' 'ideality,' 'vocation,' 'existence' and 'care'" (p. 24). I found this essay not only helpful in systematically laying out various different uses of the terms at issue but also in bringing to light the precision of the aforementioned Husserlian concepts. However, it would have been more helpful still had Heinämaa also shown us how to map one set of concepts onto the other.

In the second essay, Leslie MacAvoy challenges Crowell's prioritization of normativity over meaning, that meanings or "norms for objects . . . get their normative standing in relation to norms for skills and practices to which agents must adhere," which in turn "derive their normativity from the practical identities" assumed by agents (p. 29). MacAvoy argues, because of Husserl and Heidegger's consistent disavowal of psychologism, phenomenology cannot reduce meanings -- or logical, a priori objects -- to what must ultimately be psychological, personal, and otherwise contingent skills and practices (pp. 37-40). However, MacAvoy seems to conflate the ontical with the ontological in a way Crowell does not (pp. 331-333). Regardless of the logical and metaphysical natures of ontical entities, both the later "genetic" Husserl and Heidegger are primarily concerned with how we have wound up making sense of them rather than claim that how we make sense of them just is their exhaustive determination.

The last two essays of Section I are devoted to exploring the limits of the phenomenological method in explaining normativity and meaning. In his essay, David R. Cerbone engages Hubert Dreyfus's assertion that the "background" of social practices and norms operate best and most smoothly when they are least discursively articulable. Or, as Crowell characterizes the Dreyfusian view, "the background bottoms out in bodily skills and practical abilities" (p. 336). Cerbone, however, ends up proposing an even more radically deflationary account because, he argues, no background is in fact "fixed or determined" (p. 76). Accordingly, Cerbone concludes with a kind of metaethical recommendation reminiscent of Levinas: "the task of phenomenology lies in cultivating an openness to that kind of critical reflection" over being inevitably misunderstood by some other, such that phenomenology might be "understood positively as addressing the ongoing ethical challenge of making sense of and to one another" (Ibid.). I do, however, share Crowell's following concern: Cerbone "seems to conflate the transcendental project of clarifying meaning with the mundane project of explaining some meaning by making the background explicit" (p. 336).

Martin Kavka writes in his entry that "Crowell shows how to chasten phenomenology of religion's tendency toward theological flights of fancy" (p. 81), an antidote to the so-called "theological turn" in recent French phenomenology. Although Crowell (2002) officially disavows such theological considerations as mere "groundless speculation" (p. 84, cited by Kavka), Kavka nevertheless finds in Crowell (2008) an inadvertent opening to theology. "What is the difference," Kavka rhetorically asks, "between Levinas's claim that the face is the trace of the divine," which Crowell (2002) rejects, "and Heidegger's claim that the unknown God is mysteriously manifest as the unknown God," which Crowell (2008) ostensibly exculpates? (p. 88) But it seems to me Kavka defuses his own challenge by admitting that Crowell reads the later Heidegger's invocation of God as "idiomatic" of the "call of conscience" in Being and Time (pp. 86-87). So, even if the later Heidegger should have reversed his earlier, solipsistic position by othering the caller of conscience into Being as such, insofar as there is no further reason in Heidegger to equate Being with God, if Crowell's right that the later Heidegger's invocation of God is merely figurative of Being then he seems to leave little opening for any theological distraction.

In the first essay of Section II, John Drummond challenges Crowell's contention that, since -- "on pain of infinite regress" (p. 103) -- there must be "something more fundamental than intentionality, something that is a prior condition for intentionality . . . Husserl's intrinsically intentional, absolute consciousness cannot be the sufficient ground for the normativity of intentional acts" (p. 101). In contrast, Drummond argues that intentionality is, in fact, "primitive" or "basic" enough to found both meaning and normativity (p. 102). Drummond's reasoning depends on a disambiguation of "intentionality" into, on one hand, the familiar object-constitutive kind (Querintentionalität) and, on the other, a Langsintentionalität that, although "directed to the flow of concrete experiences it informs," (p. 104) must not be confused as constitutive of the self as any object. The distinction in turn rests on non-objectifying self-awareness of the "intentional form of the concrete flow of intentional experiences" that make up the concrete self (Ibid). In other words, non-objectifying (i.e., "pre-reflective" and "non-thematizing") self-awareness precludes access to any non-intentional self. As I understand Drummond, there should therefore be no metaphysically separable transcendental self that constitutes the concrete, temporal self as though the latter were like any other worldly object. Consequently, there should be no fear of any infinite regress.

In Being and Time, one initially gets the impression that authentic Dasein, by virtue of its freedom from social determination, may be left with no direction for decision-making at all. "For Dasein to act," Irene McMullin writes in her essay, "it requires normative resources that go beyond both" the formal emptiness of "the transcendental I-myself" as well as the social norms of das Man (p. 139). Otherwise, Dasein risks being forced between "neurotic decisionism" and relapse into the nihilism of pre-established social norms (pp. 140, 144-145). McMullin's solution is to explain what Heidegger means by "readiness to anxiety" as "a middle ground between the inauthentic mode" of blindly accepting social conventions and the paralysis of uncanniness from "the break down event" (p. 146). Because this "constant latent" anxiety "is almost always followed by an incredible sense of relief and gratitude" that one has not, after all, suffered from complete meltdown, McMullin identifies "readiness to anxiety" as a kind of morally significant "affect" rather than a spontaneous cognitive or moral attitude (pp. 146-149).

In the first essay of Section III, Mark Okrent challenges the "conception of the self as normative achievement": "one achieves a human self neither by overcoming the passivity in the agent's nature," as proposed by Korsgaard nor, as Crowell suggests, "by overcoming anonymity by taking responsibility for oneself as a task" (pp. 157, 162). Neither, according to Okrent, can ultimately avoid a regress of reasons (pp. 166-173). For a Kantian agent must nevertheless justify her self-identifying norms, then justify whatever principle invoked, leading to a "vicious regress" (p. 166). Similarly, even if authentic, Heidegger's Dasein can be distinguished from animal nature only if she can discursively "give an account of [her] actions" when normatively determining herself -- thereby, also generating the regress (p. 173). While falling short of explicitly claiming so, Okrent strongly suggests that there may be no such thing as normative achievement of selfhood at all.

By contrast, Glenda Satne and Bernardo Ainbinder seek to "reintroduce intentional agents into the natural world without reducing the space of reasons to that of nature" (p. 187). Their strategy is to reject the traditional univocal conception of intentional content as necessarily semantic, in favor of regarding linguistic communities as phylogenetically evolved extensions of biological nature, consisting of "naturally evolved sociocultural practices" (p. 190). Satne and Ainbinder's piece segues nicely into the next entry, Joseph Rouse's similarly naturalistic view, which proposes to reconcile "our discursive normativity and our animality" with "an ecological-developmental conception of biological normativity" (pp. 197, 207). Ecologically sensitive evolutionary adaptations give rise to natural, biological constraints that are "one-dimensionally normative" (p. 207). Since, nevertheless, some Dasein can be "misaligned" with the social practices of others, an additional dimension emerges through "partially autonomous practices" (pp. 208-209). I take it that this "two-dimensional mutual normative accountability without already-determinate norms" is how Rouse proposes to naturalistically map the inauthentic-authentic divide in Heidegger (p. 210). However, as we saw in MacAvoy's piece, such naturalistic accounts often risk committing the genetic fallacy: that some primates have evolved from screeching monkeys to language-bloviating simians, doesn't absolve the apes from having to explain the necessary abstractness of, for example, mathematical concepts.

In the first essay of Section IV, Joseph K. Schear explores a position ostensibly opposed to McMullin's. Whereas McMullin regards not only the mood of anxiety but also the "readiness to anxiety" as passive and affective, Schear wonders whether anxiety itself in Heidegger isn't, instead, "active." Now, Schear is careful to distinguish between acting as "agents with respect to our mood," which Heidegger clearly allows, and the mood itself: just because I can act upon, control or manage my mood, does not imply that the mood itself is active (p. 221). Nevertheless, by comparing our assessment of moods against how we assess beliefs and attitudes considered canonical of mental activity, Schear not only successfully sheds doubt on our assumption that moods are of a kind radically different from beliefs -- but also, ironically and perhaps inadvertently, forces us to wonder whether there is anything genuinely active or spontaneous about us at all (pp. 220-225). For, at least it seemed to me, the conclusion of his argument can be flipped: the best explanation of why we can assess our moods the way we assess our cognitive capacities may, instead, challenge our ancient assumption that cognition is an act that we inflict rather than an event from which we suffer.

In his entry, Matthew Burch suggests that moral philosophy's traditional focus on akrasia, that weakness of will is what disempowers rational judgment, is too narrow to cover some obviously relevant cases. As I read him, that's because the better question is how rational judgment qua reason alone­­ -- buttressed not even by the grandstanding vanity of self-righteousness or, colloquially, virtue-signaling -- should exercise any motivational influence on action at all. The recalcitrant cases are when an agent "settles the question of what to do and then . . . freely and intentionally does something else" without any self-critical emotional component like guilt or shame (p. 233). Employing Harry Frankfurt's notion of "interest" -- which is "reflexive" (thus, affective), but facilitated by significant others, emotions, moods, as well as by social norms -- Burch accounts for the recalcitrant cases in a way the akrasia-centered approaches cannot (pp. 235-244).

Unlike the first four sections, which are largely practical-philosophical, the final section is centered on theoretical issues. It opens with Walter Hopp's strong reading of Crowell's otherwise seemingly innocuous assertion that "intentionality is a normatively structured notion, governed by conditions of success and failure" (p. 285, cited by Hopp) by asking whether intentionality is "intrinsically" or "constitutively" normative.[1] Since, if intentionality is constitutively normative then so is knowledge; should knowledge turn out not be intrinsically normative then neither is intentionality. While admitting that his case against the normativity of epistemology is "not quite as strong" as Husserl's case against the normativity of logic (p. 279), Hopp nonetheless heroically challenges the widespread view that epistemology is, like ethics, an intrinsically normative enterprise (pp. 279-285).

In the sixteenth essay, Charles Siewert proposes an alternative to both Alex Byrne's "thin" conception of visual experience as well as Susanna Siegel's "rich" conception. On the thin conception, visual experience only features those low-level properties like color, shape and texture, that in principle can be determined by measurable facts of the visible object. By contrast, Siegel advocates an "assertoric" conception of vision, according to which visual experiences are like beliefs in that they can track or "predicate" higher-order properties, like being "a bird, a child, a hat" or "being bored, amused, afraid," and the like (p. 292). While more sympathetic to Siegel's camp, Siewert disagrees that visual appearances are belief-like -- thus normatively assessable for accuracy -- since visual experiences also feature exclusively phenomenological "recognitional" properties reminiscent of what Husserl calls "hyletic data," which Husserl denies are intentional for they neither represent nor supervene upon any spatial or "locational" property of the visible object (p. 302; see also, Shim 2011). Because, although phenomenologically palpable -- thus, intrinsic to the visual experience -- these recognitional properties are incorrigibly idiosyncratic, no such recognitional appearance can be dismissed as inaccurate; in which case, there is "no reason to suppose the recognitional appearance is ever properly deemed 'accurate' either" (p. 300). Although recognitional appearances cannot be assessed for accuracy, rather than abandon normativity, Siewert concludes by recommending appraisal not of the content of the visual experience but, instead, of how we look at things: e.g., getting a better look or taking another look, and the like (pp. 303-304).

That we should be able to access a world of meanings and norms irreducible to the scientifically discernible facts of nature, Husserl affirms with the introduction of the epoché or the phenomenological reduction. As Crowell characterizes it, what "unites" the entire phenomenological tradition -- "including Heidegger, Sartre, Beauvoir, Merleau-Ponty, Levinas, and even Derrida -- is a 'reduction' from our ordinary concern with entities, beings . . . to the meaning at issue in such concern" (pp. 329-330; my italic). Unfortunately, despite the centrality of the epoché to the entire tradition, there are almost as many interpretations of it as there are scholars willing to talk about it.

For instance, in the third essay, Dan Zahavi challenges Crowell's view that the epoché commits transcendental phenomenology to metaphysical neutrality. According to Zahavi, were the epoché neutralizing enough for transcendental phenomenology "to live in peaceful co-existence with a variety of different metaphysical views" then "Husserl would have been unable to reject both the Kantian Ding an sich and phenomenalism as unequivocally as he does" (p. 50). So, since Husserl's transcendental turn is exclusive of certain metaphysical positions (realism, phenomenalism, eliminativism), Zahavi infers it must imply some kind of metaphysics of its own. "Rather than making reality disappear from view," Zahavi contends, "the epoché and reduction is precisely what allows reality" -- rather than just meanings and norms -- "to be investigated philosophically" (p. 53).

By contrast again, in the penultimate entry, Dermot Moran downplays any metaphysical import, one way or the other, of neutralizing the "natural attitude." Instead, for Moran, the primary purpose of the epoché is to study the natural attitude -- along with its natural-scientific, as well as its metaphysical consequences -- as itself an accomplishment of transcendental subjectivity (pp. 307-308, 314). A preeminent, orthodox Husserl scholar, Moran then cashes in some of Crowell's claim of a unified tradition by recruiting Merleau-Ponty as defender of Husserl against Heidegger's "less generous" reading (pp. 315, 316-323). Despite Husserl's well-known characterization of the natural attitude as "general thesis" (p. 318) -- thus, from the Heideggerian perspective, a "thetic" or explicitly cognitive stance -- Moran persuasively demonstrates that, although the foundation of obviously theoretical enterprises, the natural attitude is otherwise "embedded in circumspective concern" and, therefore, coheres with Heidegger's worldly Dasein. "In this sense," Moran concludes, "Husserl and Heidegger do not fundamentally disagree" (p. 316).

Sensibly organized by the editors, I found this Festschrift to be a deeply absorbing and intellectually entertaining read. Above all, I applaud the provocative boldness and daring of its contributors. Although addressed to an audience familiar enough with the phenomenological tradition, because almost all of the contributors write in clear, plain English, I'm sure curious philosophers from outside the tradition, if open-minded and willing enough to put in a bit of work, should also find it accessible.


Crowell, S. (2002) "Authentic Thinking and Phenomenological Method," The New Year Book for Philosophy and Phenomenological Philosophy 2, pp. 23-37

Crowell, S. (2008) "Measure-Taking: Meaning and Normativity in Heidegger's Philosophy," Continental Philosophy Review 41, pp. 261-276

Shim, M. (2011) "Representationalism and Husserlian Phenomenology," Husserl Studies 27, pp. 197-215

[1] Hopp admits his strong interpretation of Crowell is not ascriptive, only that Crowell's claim in isolation "admits of several readings," the weakest of which Hopp agrees is "enormously plausible" (p. 272).